Postanalytic and Metacontinental: Crossing Philosophical Divides

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Jack Reynolds, James Chase, James Williams, and Edwin Mares (eds.), Postanalytic and Metacontinental: Crossing Philosophical Divides, Continuum, 2010, 255pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826424419.

Reviewed by Timothy J. Nulty, University of Massachusetts-Dartmouth


This important book is one of the better anthologies currently available on the relationship, or lack thereof, between the typically disparate traditions of analytic and continental philosophy. The anthology contains essays that offer broader general assessments of methodological differences between traditions as well as a number of very good essays on specific points of convergence or divergence between the traditions. The editors and authors are to be commended for their diligence in avoiding two common mistakes when characterizing these traditions -- either an essentialism which denies the possibility of meaningful dialogue between traditions or a deflationary view prone to ignoring important methodological and substantive differences between analytic and continental philosophy. Indeed, the editors, in their introduction, offer strong considerations for rejecting both of these characterizations while providing examples of their prevalence in the literature. This anthology is a valuable resource for those currently engaged in comparative work and for those who want to understand these two traditions beyond the usual superficial and frequently unjustified characterizations. In what follows, I will provide a brief summary of each of the major sections first and then return to examine in greater detail some of the chapters.

The anthology is divided into four main parts which follow two introductory chapters. The first major section of the book on reasoning and argument is perhaps the best section of the anthology. The four chapters in Part One are particularly strong in their respective attempts to examine the different roles of argument and reasoning in each tradition, as well as examining the background presuppositions about argument forms operative in each tradition. The chapters of Part One contain some excellent insights into the sources of the methodological differences typically used to characterize each tradition. James Chase and Jack Reynolds examine the fate of transcendental reasoning in analytic and continental philosophy. Edwin Mares explores the relationship of priority between logic and metaphysics in the works of Michael Dummett and Martin Heidegger. Simon Glendinning argues against the view that 'narrow argument' is the only methodological inheritance of contemporary philosophy. Chase argues that analytic philosophy has been constrained by various versions of epistemic conservatism, and that in turn explains some of the differences from continental philosophy.

The two chapters of Part Two concern the philosophy of mind. The second chapter (chapter 8) by Massimiliano Cappuccio and Michael Wheeler correctly argues for the possibility of collaboration between analytic philosophy of mind informed by cognitive science and phenomenologists continuing the work of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty such as Hubert Dreyfus. The prior chapter by Pascal Gillot is perhaps the least congruent chapter with the main theme of the anthology. Pascal focuses on the implicit Cartesianism of John Searle's philosophy of mind, and he makes a convincing case for his claim that Searle has failed to distance himself adequately from certain Cartesian assumptions. However, this historical analysis does not address itself in any detail to the contemporary relationship between analytic and continental approaches to the philosophy of mind. The reader is left wondering how Searle's Cartesian difficulties might be mitigated by adapting some of the anti-Cartesian elements from the phenomenological tradition.

Part Three contains three essays on meaning, expressivism and aesthetics. Nicholas Smith's essay examines expressivism as exemplified in the works of Robert Brandom and Charles Taylor. Smith's essay explores Brandom's and Taylor's expressivism as differing rejections of dominant analytic representationalism. Dale Jacquette argues against the attempts of both analytic and continental philosophers to bring the earlier or later Wittgenstein into the fold of their respective traditions. He claims both traditions have misread Wittgenstein's work. Robert Sinnerbrink explores the marginalization of continental film theory and its replacement by a cognitivist-oriented analytic approach. Sinnerbrink ultimately argues for a pluralistic approach to philosophical treatments of film, one which can accommodate both analytic and continental methodologies.

Part Four contains three essays covering metaphysical topics on German Idealism, the selection and individuation of events, and mathematical Platonism. Paul Redding examines the works of two arguably 'postanalytic' philosophers, Brandom and John McDowell, and how their respective work exemplifies a kind of Hegelian turn in analytic philosophy. James Williams offers a Deleuzian reading of Donald Davidson's theory of events, highlighting areas of divergence and suggesting areas of possible engagement. Lastly, Pierre Cassou-Noguès compares forms of mathematical Platonism in the works of Albert Lautman and Kurt Gödel.

The authors of chapter two, "'Postanalytic' Philosophy: Overcoming the Divide?" offer a compelling empirically-based corrective to the standard armchair descriptions about philosophers who are sometimes taken as bridging the gap between analytic and continental philosophy. The authors offer both a weaker and a stronger characterization of 'postanalytic' philosophy, though they eventually suggest that a characterization between the weaker and stronger perspectives is the most accurate. According to the weaker characterization, postanalytic philosophers are those who have criticized various aspects of mainstream analytic philosophy, such as scheme-content dualism (i.e., Davidson's third dogma) or representationalism in the philosophy of language and mind. According to the stronger characterization, postanalytic philosophers ultimately reject the analytic tradition as a failed project and represent a new way of doing philosophy with new types of questions and issues and with new methods. Rorty, Brandom, Davidson, McDowell, Putnam and Wittgenstein are sometimes labeled as postanalytic philosophers in one of the above senses.

The authors examine the claim that various postanalytic philosophers are 'crossover' figures who have bridged the divide between analytic and continental philosophy by their engagement with continental thought. The authors provide journal citation data to support their claim that although Davidson, McDowell, and Wittgenstein are cited in continental journals and crossover journals with some frequency, there is not yet the kind of shared thematic concerns and methodological assumptions which would let us conclude there is a shared philosophical movement which has bridged the analytic-continental divide. The journal citation data suggest that although both analytic and continental philosophers find points of interest in the work of postanalytic philosophers, there are still not common focal points of research between the two traditions. The essay offers an interesting sociological perspective on what is happening in the profession.

Chase and Reynolds' "The Fate of Transcendental Reasoning in Contemporary Philosophy" compares analytic and continental valuations of transcendental arguments. The authors provide an unbiased assessment of this mode of reasoning from the perspective of each tradition. With some notable exceptions (e.g., some of Strawson's work), analytic philosophers have maintained a skeptical attitude toward transcendental arguments, while such forms of argumentation are commonplace among continental philosophers. Indeed, among many continental philosophers examinations of the transcendental conditions of given phenomena are taken to be part of the essence of philosophy.

Chase and Reynolds do an excellent job of uncovering the major sources of analytic skepticism toward transcendental reasoning. The authors trace skepticism about transcendental arguments to worries about necessity originating in radical empiricism and naturalized epistemology. The authors correctly point out that there need not always be hostility between phenomenologically-based transcendental reasoning and empirically-constrained naturalized philosophy as is evidenced by the work of Merleau-Ponty and, more recently, Dreyfus. The more optimistic claims of this chapter find support in Cappuccio and Wheeler's essay.

Mares' "Logic and Metaphysics: Dummett Meets Heidegger" brings Heidegger and Dummett into dialogue on whether logic or metaphysics should have a methodological priority in philosophy. Mares accurately represents the views of Heidegger and Dummett, but the considerations he gives for his own view -- a kind of reflective equilibrium in which we reason about logic and metaphysics all at once -- are not likely to convince some logicians who view logic as a self-justifying endeavor such as Francesco Paoli and Greg Restall whose works are based on Gentzen's sequent calculus. And it appears much of the recent work in non-classical logic, for example, proceeds without the need for metaphysics. The shortcomings of Dummett's logic-first approach, and its reliance on intuitionist logic, cannot be so easily generalized to more recent developments in logic.

Glendinning, in his "Argument All the Way Down: The Demanding Discipline of Non-Argumento-Centric Modes of Philosophy," claims that the adversarial account of the relationship between analytic and continental philosophy -- characterized by narrow analytic argumento-centrism on the one side and something less rationally rigorous or literary on the other side -- is a mistaken oversimplification. Philosophy, Glendinning tell us, aims to make clear a distinction between legitimate and illegitimate forms of persuasion, the former being a matter of rational conviction and the latter of merely being persuaded. If rational conviction is the goal of philosophy, and narrow argument typically exemplified in analytic writings is not the only form of writing capable of effectively generating rational conviction, then continental philosophy is an equal heir to the philosophical tradition insofar as it too offers argumentative writing though not narrowly conceived.

Glendinning makes the interesting argument that as a factual matter it is often not argument narrowly conceived which effectively brings about shifts in our rational conviction; rather, it is the deployment of our imaginative capacities, such as we might see in moral philosophizing. We might also consider phenomenological literature in which rational persuasion occurs through a kind of 'seeing' more correctly or more clearly, a method we could also reasonably attribute to Wittgenstein, Ryle, and Austin, as embodying a legitimate argumentative philosophical form which is not narrowly argumentative or argumento-centric. Indeed, Glendinning is on good ground here, for even if argument is conceived in the argumento-centric sense, validity alone cannot tell us about the world. We need true premises, not merely logical relations, and in some ultimate sense narrow argument must come to an end and we must simply 'see' that the premises are true or false. And so it seems argumento-centric philosophy depends implicitly or explicitly on some broader and perhaps phenomenological conception of argument and evidence.

"When the Twain Meet: Could the Study of the Mind be a Meeting of the Minds?" by Cappuccio and Wheeler is a good model of what a less factionalized approach to a philosophical issue should look like. The authors examine the way in which engagement between the phenomenological tradition and analytic philosophy of mind can lead to better solutions to the 'frame problem' in Artificial Intelligence. As Dreyfus has repeatedly pointed out, the frame problem in some ways was predictable as an artifact of representationalism, and these problems with representationalism were made explicit previously in the phenomenology of Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. The ways in which Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty avoid problems with representationalism suggest solutions to the frame problem.

One of the strongest and most significant claims of this essay is that postanalytic and metacontinental philosophy will take seriously both a phenomenological analysis of human experience and the various aspects of cognitive science. The authors convincingly argue that we have two explanatory levels: (1) the personal-level explanations of phenomenology and (2) the subpersonal endeavor of cognitive science. These two levels are not reductively related, but neither are they wholly independent. There can and should be a fruitful interchange between them. And, indeed, Dreyfus' criticisms of AI are one such example. Cognitive science can explain at a causal level certain phenomenological features of our experience. Phenomenological analysis of human experience can offer new avenues of inquiry to naturalized analytic philosophy of mind and cognitive science. For readers wondering what exactly postanalytic and metacontinental philosophy would look like and why we should adopt such a philosophical stance, this essay is one of the best examples available.

Another good example of what bridging the analytic-continental gap might look like is Sinnerbrink's "Disenfranchising Film? On the Analytic-Cognitivist Turn in Film Theory." Sinnerbeck argues that the once dominant philosophical approach to film -- based on psychoanalytic, semiotic, structuralist, Marxist, critical theory, and post-structuralist perspectives -- has been usurped by an analytic-cognitivist perspective which seeks to eliminate its philosophical predecessor. Sinnerbrink's 'crucial distinction' is between philosophy of film, which seeks to offer a theoretical explanation of the nature of film (the analytic-cognitive perspective), and film-philosophy, which puts philosophy into dialogue with film as another way of doing philosophy (the continental perspective).

Sinnerbrink motivates the view that there are questions of value and meaning that are not reducible to questions amenable to naturalistic or scientific explanations. Insofar as those questions are legitimately philosophical, film-philosophy is a rationally acceptable philosophical method. Thus, the argument for some form of philosophical pluralism rests on the claim that legitimate philosophical questions are not of one type, and so no single method can be privileged to the exclusion of others. Philosophy of film treats film as an object of analysis, while film-philosophy treats film and philosophy as equal though different forms of reflection.

Sinnerbrink's conception of these two ways of considering the relationship between philosophy and film is a useful one in that it brings to light background assumptions in each tradition. It is also useful because it advocates for a kind of philosophical pluralism grounded in the legitimacy of different kinds of questions. However, analytically trained philosophers will be left wanting at the end of this essay. If film has an equal philosophical relevance as philosophy proper, or is even superior in some cases, then there ought to be at least some specific cases in which we can see that art, and film-philosophy more specifically, can show what cannot be said in philosophy more narrowly conceived, and that the showing is philosophically sound. Sinnerbrink is successful in explaining why and how film-philosophy has been marginalized, but he does not convincingly show that the marginalizing was completely unjustified. Hence, while his case for philosophical pluralism in general is strong, the specific case made for film-philosophy is more dubious.

Postanalytic and Metacontinental: Crossing Philosophical Divides is a worthwhile read for anyone interested in getting an objective assessment of the differences between analytic and continental philosophy. With one or two exceptions, nearly all of the essays are of high quality and serve the overall theme of the anthology. Anyone interested in a broader understanding of contemporary philosophy will want to own this collection of essays.