Postphenomenological Investigations: Essays on Human-Technology Relations

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Robert Rosenberger and Peter-Paul Verbeek (eds.), Postphenomenological Investigations: Essays on Human-Technology Relations, Lexington Books, 2015, 265pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739194362.

Reviewed by Larry A. Hickman, Southern Illinois University Carbondale


This collection provides an excellent overview of current work in one of the most important current approaches to the philosophy of technology. It comprises a preface by Don Ihde, an introduction by the editors, Robert Rosenberger and Peter-Paul Verbeek, and sixteen essays divided into four sections: 1) a field guide to postphenomenology, 2) postphenomenological theories, 3) postphenomenological case studies, and 4) essays by critics.

In his richly informative preface, Ihde "positions" postphenomenology with respect to a) the history of science-technology studies and b) the context of current alternative approaches. He tells us that postphenomenology is a "particular mode of science-technology interpretation" and that "its arrival coincides with a late-twentieth- to twenty-first-century radical shift in science-technology analysis" associated with the 1979 publication of two books: Laboratory Life: The Construction of Scientific Facts by Bruno Latour and Steve Woolgar, and Ihde's own book Technics and Praxis (viii).

Whereas Ihde's book emphasized "embodiment in relation to technology uses," the approach of Latour and Woolgar was more linguistically and textually focused. In this regard Ihde's expanded comparison of postphenomenology to the Actor-Network Theory (ANT) of Bruno Latour and Michel Callon (xv-xvi) is particularly helpful. Since Ihde coined the term "postphenomenology" and is the driving force behind the movement that bears that name, readers may wish to visit (or revisit) the introduction to his Postphenomenology (1993), in which he provided a somewhat sharper definition of the term as "a nonfoundational and nontranscentdental phenomenology which makes variational theory its most important methodological strategy" (7). In that work he also mentions the contribution of American pragmatists Richard Rorty and John Dewey to the trajectory of his project -- a matter that he unfortunately does not revisit here.

The editors' introduction is likewise highly informative. Their characterization of postphenomenology emphasizes its bottom-up empirical turn away from top-down "classical" approaches to philosophy of technology such as those of Martin Heidegger and Karl Jaspers that tended to privilege abstract theoretical concerns over serious consideration of artifacts. (Heidegger's early work did touch on tool use, of course, but his later work on technology was abstract and dystopian.) Verbeek's What Things Do: Philosophical Reflections on Technology, Agency, and Design (2005) offered an extensive account of this empirical turn. Practitioners of postphenomenology address issues such as "scientific and medical imaging, computer interface, virtual reality, traffic safety, robotics, educational technologies, sustainable design, wearable computing, and bodily implants" (2). The editors' summaries of the sixteen essays provide the reader with a helpful roadmap of the book's organization and content.

In the first essay, Rosenberger and Verbeek chart the progression from phenomenology to postphenomenology, that is, from what they term the romanticism of classical philosophy of technology to empirical studies and philosophical analysis of the relations between human beings and their artifacts. Put another way, this is a progression from attempts to describe the world to attempts to understand the relations between human beings and their world. Postphenomenology thus reveals the influence of some of the central themes of American pragmatism: anti-foundationalism, mediation, materiality, concreteness, practice, and the enlargement of meanings.

The backbone of Ihde's postphenomenology consists of four basic forms of technological mediation: embodiment relations, hermeneutic relations, alterity relations, and background relations (13). These categories appear again and again in the remaining essays as a kind of frame on which empirical studies can be fleshed out. Embodiment relations are those in which a user's experience is reshaped through a device. Eye glasses, for example, become a part of the user's perceptual experience -- transparent in use. Hermeneutic relations, such as looking at and interpreting a wristwatch, are those in which "the user experiences a transformed encounter with the world via the direct experience and interpretation of the technology itself" (17). In this case, the transparency of the relation will depend on the interpreter's familiarity with the device. Alterity relations are those in which we relate to technical devices in ways that are similar to the ways in which we relate to other humans. IPhone users, for example, tend to relate to Siri as a quasi-other. Finally, our background relations with appliances such as refrigerators and air conditioners make up our environmental context.

Unlike Latour's ANT, postphenomenology is careful to preserve the distinction between human and nonhuman entities. Like ANT, however, (and like pragmatism) postphenomenology treats subjectivity and objectivity as the product of relations rather than their starting point. As a part of its relational approach to technology, postphenomenology probes the question of the non-neutrality of artifacts. Some artifacts are said to be "multistable" in the sense that they possess multiple stabilities or variations. A hammer, for example, can drive nails, serve as a paperweight, or even perform as a murder weapon -- to name a just a few of its many stabilities. Here postphenomenology sides with pragmatism against classical Husserlian phenomenology. Postphenomenology -- with "its pragmatic commitments to anti-essentialism and context-dependent knowledge -- rejects the idea that variational analysis enables one to discover the essence of an object of study" (26-27).

Rosenberger and Verbeek are eager to point out that postphenomenological studies, although empirical and thus in many ways diverse, do share certain elements. First, they tend to focus "on understanding the roles that technologies play in the relations between humans and world." Second, they "always include empirical work as a basis for philosophical reflection." Third, they "typically investigate how, in the relations that arise around a technology, a specific 'world' is constituted, as well as a specific 'subject.'" And fourth, they "typically make a conceptual analysis of the implications of technologies'" (31-32, italics in original). Whereas ANT tends to focus on actors, postphenomenology tends to focus on relations.

Lenore Langsdorf's "Why Postphenomenology Needs a Metaphysics," initiates Section 2. What is already present in postphenomenology, she points out, is an interrelational ontology, that is, an account of what is in the environment. What is needed, however, is "a process metaphysics that provides a theory of how interrelation produces novel entities" (47). She thus proposes that postphenomenology recognize and expand its relation to the pragmatism of Dewey and that it also apply the lessons of ethnomethodology -- that is, "phenomenologically inspired case studies of how members of a society develop methods for organizing and accounting for their environments" (50). In brief, Langsdorf suggests that postphenomenology loosen up a bit by taking a look at the genesis of its human-technology relations -- how they come to be. This is an important essay that some readers may wish had been expanded.

Kirk M. Besmer discusses the distinctions between virtual re-embodiment, which "occurs to some degree in video games," and robotic re-embodiment, which occurs in tele-surgery (55). Using the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty as a point of departure and building out from the case of IW, a subject who has lost cutaneous touch and somatic proprioceptive awareness, Besmer distinguishes between "body image," which consists of a "complex set of intentional states and dispositions," and "body schema," which involves a "pre-reflexive synthesis of inputs from multiple bodily systems . . .that structures, constrains, and enables intentional bodily activity" (63). He concludes that whereas virtual re-embodiment such as video games provides users with a sense of being active, we should avoid thinking of robotic arms, for example, as "technological extensions of embodiment on the same order" (68).

Aud Sissel Hoel and Annamaria Carusi offer an expansion of the work of Merleau-Ponty on perception and embodiment. They are critical of those such as Ihde who view his work as a part of the classical tradition in philosophy of technology that regards technoscience as alienating, and they want to realize what they regard as the potential of his approach by understanding the body as a technological body that targets, engages, interrogates, and forms the world in which it operates (82).

Marie-Christine Nizzi discusses variations of the embodied self in science fiction films, including Blade Runner and Avatar. She concludes that movies that predict loss of self by undermining core features of our embodiment overlook the fact that human-technology relations are progressive, allowing for what she calls "successive updates of the norm." As a result, she suggests, "we can expect our concept of the self to behave as a dynamic, dialectic, and . . . multistable reality of human experience" (103).

Fernando Secomandi provides an interesting discussion of whether the body should be treated as a technological artifact that mediates human experience and he encourages postphenomenology to explore aspects of the body as quasi-others or image bodies. Asle H. Kiran encourages research into four dimensions of technological mediation: the ontological dimension (revealing-concealing), the epistemological dimension (magnification-reduction), the practical dimension (enabling-constraining), and the ethical dimension (involving-alienating). He suggests that improved understanding of these dimensions can promote research in a number of scientific disciplines.

Section 3 begins with Yoni Van Den Eede's essay on self-tracking technologies such as Fitbit. Given its structural features, it is clear that postphenomenology can play a role in understanding such tools. But he argues that it is important to go further, to see the implications for reversing the relationship by utilizing self-tracking technology to expand the structural features of postphenomenology. Van Den Eede presents excellent examples. Søren Riis presents an interesting study of speed in the twentieth century in the context of the postphenomenological category of multistability. Frances Bottenberg's study of interviewing humanoid robots, especially their eye contact, is both fascinating and a bit chilling. Some readers will wish that she had tied her presentation more closely to the central themes of postphenomenology.

Chris Kaposy's postphenomenological study of medical ethics education at a Canadian medical school raises important issues but also might have been a bit more forthcoming regarding its connections to the themes of postphenomenology. Adam M. Rosenfeld turns to Aristotle as well as postphenomenology in his analysis of brain-dead bodies and organ transplant protocols. He distinguishes between a living body and a lived body and considers the multistability of three téchnai that must be managed with respect to the brain-dead body: the life saving technê of the trauma team and grieving practices by the family, the context of the transplant surgeons, and organ procurement organization. Finally in this section, Jan Kyrre Berg Friis utilizes postphenomenological tools to discuss two overlapping approaches to radiology: technological "fixes" that emphasize improved instrumentation and hermeneutic studies that attempt to understand how the radiologist interacts with technological mediation.

The final Section contains essays by three well known philosophers who examine postphenomenology from the outside. Andrew Feenberg is quick to say that he agrees with Ihde on many points. He nevertheless thinks that Ihde has been too critical of Heidegger, and he presents an alternative understanding of mediation that takes into account the critique of formal rationality advanced by Georg Lukács. Feenberg challenges postphenomenologists to consider more deeply the political implications of their research. Diane P. Michelfelder challenges postphenomenological research in another area: what she calls "technologies in the making." She sees certain emerging technologies as qualitatively different than those that are the concern of postphenomenology since new tracking technologies (as opposed to the self-tracking technologies that Van Den Eede discussed) are those that do not involve human-technology mediation. They instead involve technologies of which individuals are generally unaware. Finally, Albert Borgmann draws an important distinction between variational theory, which begins with perceptions and points to invariant references, and multistability theory, which starts with the reference and explores the variety of senses. Borgmann suggests that postphenomenology would do well to pay more attention to the former.

This is a well-conceived and articulated book and certainly one that both advances studies in the philosophy of technology and contributes to new ways of thinking about phenomenology. Some readers might wish, however, that more attention had been paid to the contributions of pragmatism to the development of postphenomenology. Apart from Langsdorf's essay, there is not much of that here in this otherwise admirable collection.