Pragmatic Fashions: Pluralism, Democracy, Relativism, and the Absurd

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John J. Stuhr, Pragmatic Fashions: Pluralism, Democracy, Relativism, and the Absurd, Indiana University Press, 2016, 256pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253018915.

Reviewed by Jacquelyn A. K. Kegley, California State University, Bakersfield


This book posits that a philosophy is a personal expression, a work of art, or a fashion of thought. This means that philosophies have less to do with argument, disembodied reason, and impersonal truth and more to do with feeling, including the sentiment of rationality, social meaning and creative vision. Philosophies should not be seen as oppositional but rather as imaginative expressions that may critically engage other philosophical expressions while seeking to make possible more meaningful lives. Finally, philosophies are irreducibly tied to time and place. Thus, for John J. Stuhr, pragmatism is an expression of a fallible, experimental, pluralist, relativist, radically democratic, instrumental, and practice-centered this worldly sensibility.

Drawing on William James, Stuhr also argues for a relativism of values, called 'relationalism.' This relativism in ethics is seen as parallel to relativity theory in physics; Stuhr claims that 'Einstein is the William James of Physics.' He sees relativism as an alternative to absolutism and nihilism that will, he hopes, in practice avoid the atrocities carried out in the names of both of these alternative positions.

Stuhr supports Dewey's idea of democracy as an ongoing experiment. And, seeing democracy as 'a way of life' fits nicely with an expressivist conception of pragmatism. However, he uses T. Randolph Bourne's criticism of Dewey's support of World War I to ask whether pragmatism can provide a compelling analysis and criticism of war or whether it devolves into either an unworkable romantic view of peace or an undesirable realistic perspective in the service of and defense of war. Stuhr probes the question of war in more detail, arguing that humankind has a 'terrible love of war' yet also a 'terrible love of hope.' Is there, he asks, as James and Jane Addams argued, 'a moral equivalent of war?' Perhaps, he suggests, it is the 'enlightened provincialism of Josiah Royce'. Finally, the notion of an "absurd pragmatism" is explored as a concluding view.

Stuhr’s excellent introduction gives a succinct overview of each chapter. The first chapter sparks interest with the unusual title: "Chance Vistas and Sincerity in the Cosmic Labyrinth." This title comes indirectly from George Santayana, who wanted to capture the idea of philosophy as personal vision tied irrevocably to a specific time and place. The chapter explores the question of differences in philosophies, which can be viewed either as an immense resource for understanding the vast and changing world or as roadblocks and parochial barriers to a common project, a common view of truth, justice and beauty. Stuhr argues that a monist view dominates philosophy today, namely, that there is one world and one truth. Traditional philosophy rejects philosophy as a personal perspective and argues for a philosophical stance called 'the view from nowhere.' Stuhr asks if such a view is possible and if it is worthwhile. He also argues that this 'view from nowhere' is based on a false assumption: that there is a subjective/objective or subject/object dualism in matters of truth and reality.

Stuhr then begins his argument that we should view philosophies as different expressions of different lives and as personal works of art and imagination. We should give up ontology and epistemology for a broad cultural aesthetics; abandon the divide between reason and feeling, logic and rhetoric; and, like James, see rationality as a sentiment. We should opt for story- telling and picture painting and recognize philosophies as autobiographies, diaries, genealogies, problem-solving proposals, even as novels and poems. Above all, a philosopher should pursue sincerity and honesty rather than omniscience. Philosophers should seek to write in a manner that avoids dogmatism.

Philosophy should understand itself as 'narrative.' In doing so it should see itself as self-consciously personal, a plural, partial, and provisional perspective rather than a universal and monistic one. A philosophy should pronounce itself as a view from a particular somewhere involving selective emphasis and choice. Philosophy should be an imaginative endeavor. In the words of Santayana, philosophy should be 'literary psychology.' It should focus on imagining how the human animal feels and thinks. In adopting this kind of philosophy, we need to recognize that storytelling enhances our ability to understand ourselves and others while reinforcing an ethics of empathy and decency.

This chapter draws heavily on the work of James, who understood philosophy, says Stuhr, as human persuasion and personal temperament. For James the pragmatic method seeks to settle disputes by drawing on experience, practical consequences, experimentation, and inquiry. For him values are pluralistic because we live in a social pluriverse in which there are equally real, plural goods and in which each individual has multiple, crisscrossing, conflicting feelings, desires, and experiences. The fulfilment or actualization of any one of these is at once a loss or destruction of other possible goods, objects or desires. James declares, in "The Will to Believe", that 'some part of the ideal must be butchered.' Finally, it is claimed that pragmatism as a matter of temperament and attitude, a vision and expression of one intimate character and a loyalty to one's own experience and world, is a compelling answer to the dogmatism, arrogance, resignation, and powerless so evident everywhere in contemporary institutions and practices.

The second chapter develops in more detail the notion of philosophies as fashions. The ultimate aim of proposing such as view, says Stuhr, is to evoke a new view of philosophy for persons with sensibilities attuned to pluralism. After discussing definitions of fashion and style, the notion of fashion is described as including at once the form of expression; the content of expression, and the act—in the sense of both behavior and affect--of expression. One central concern of Stuhr, shared with James, is to overcome the militaristic history of philosophy, one of opposition and argument. Why not see the history of philosophy as a field of opportunity for expanding one's imagination in many ways rather than as a battlefield between views, only one of which should be victorious?

Like James, Stuhr wishes to overcome the many kinds of blindness that affect human beings. An ugly kind of blindness is 'power blindness' expounded by philosophies that are expressions of power and which stimulate differences in power. Such philosophies become blind to domination and oppression, to antagonism, contest and struggle, to deprivation, and privilege. How can this and other kinds of blindness be overcome? In adopting a view of philosophies as fashions one would be humble and pluralistic and not renounce others' views, while also seeking to communicate with others and thus to understand what things means to others. Taking this attitude and stance might also change how one views things as well as oneself.

To illustrate how a pragmatist might accomplish this, Stuhr draws on the work of W. E. B. Du Bois and Addams. Du Bois provided a living narrative, a dramatic picture of what it was like to live a life under oppression and devaluation of self, through his depiction of double consciousness and through other story-telling. He sought to persuade rather than argue. Addams advocated a social ethic and a democratic view of life, arguing that one must use the daily experience of humanity as a constant correction of one's own views and actions. One must not make an exception of self and think one is different from the rank and file of one's fellows.

The third chapter poses the interesting question: 'does philosophy progress?' Institutionally philosophy has not done well as we have witnessed the downsizing or even closing of philosophy programs. Indeed, seeing philosophy as an academic discipline is disastrous, says Stuhr, in this 'post-wisdom' age. Philosophy, its methods and history, is seen as the subject matter of philosophy rather than 'life' and it is seen as a field of knowledge and about information rather than as a practice or way of life. Philosophy needs to see 'wisdom' as the practice of criticism. It must engage in the ongoing critical amelioration of problems and the reconstruction and deepening of meanings. Philosophy should be like life, a process and something always in the making, always being fashioned.

Chapter 4, "Convergence and Difference", deals with epistemology and notions of believing, doubting, investigating, knowing, and related issues. Pragmatism is seen as (1) a temperament, an empirical attitude focused on practice and consequences; (2) a way of framing problems which reconstructs and redeploys the traditional dualism of mind/body, belief/action, thought/feeling, fact/value to deal with problems related to particular interests and seeking particular results; (3) a champion of experimental inquiry; and (4) an awareness of the inseparable culture context of all of this. Pragmatism affirms fallibility, temporality and plurality. Given its emphasis on difference, then, does pragmatism commit to an eventual convergence of belief of or to an irreducible divergence of belief? In answering this question, Stuhr draws on the work of Foucault and argues that we must move beyond the traditional notion of philosophical progress to criticism, and from critical philosophy to historical politics. This involves seeing critique as a contingent limit-attitude, and substituting an archeological and genealogical history of the present for a transcendental philosophy. It requires rethinking ethics and politics as sketches of ways of thinking and commits to cultural conditions which can nurture various temperaments as well as a democratic, pluralistic philosophy.

In rethinking ethics in Chapter 5, 'It's All Relative: Beyond Absolutism and Nihilism,' Stuhr takes on the idea of James and Dewey that progress in philosophy consists of going around Kant rather than through him. Three different aspects of Kantian ethics are identified as problematic. First, Kant's conception of morality is juridical and dignity is founded on an abstract, universal faculty. This makes Kant's moral law indifferent to singularity. Secondly, Kant's morality can be seen as 'practical reason in service of religion.' Thirdly, Kant posits the moral individual as the model of the liberal state and thus as a self-legislating and self-governed person. Obeying reason is obeying self, but, argues Stuhr, this self-compulsion co-opts legitimate dissent. The kind of ethics needed, he argues, is one which involves finite immanence and a thoroughly pluralistic hope and love.

The history of philosophical ethics is seen as an extended argument between two camps: the 'ontology bloaters' who fear ethical relativism, subjectivism, skepticism and nihilism and the 'deflaters' who fear ethical fundamentalism, universalism, timelessness, certainty, infallibility, and obedience. Some believe one can find a third way between these camps, but Stuhr does not believe this is possible. He claims the absolutism/relativism divide can only be effectively transformed by a robust form of relativism which he labels 'Einsteinian.' Following James, Stuhr argues that a value is a relation; it is relative to some person and a good for that person in a way of belief. This view does not make values subjective; they are existential. And, parallel to Einstein, who postulated that laws of physics are the same for all observers in uniform motion relative to one another, so 'ethical principles are the same for all agents in uniform motion relative to one another.' Further, a pragmatic temperament is a melioristic one which seeks to transform existing values by transforming the cultural conditions that enable and sustain them. Cultural reconstruction should aim to support 'hope and hard work and humility.'

Chapter 6, "Expressions of Nature," focuses on the Hudson River School of painting and how it captures the national character as well as both Emerson's transcendental philosophy and James's pragmatic philosophy. Both nature and human nature are seen as unspoiled and original, a new world and a new character; as unique and special in human history, an exceptional place and people. It is a challenging view which affirms striving and trust in striving. The discussion of this school of painting also illustrates the notion of philosophy as expressive and a personal work of art.

Chapters 7 and 8 focus on war and democracy and the possible limits of philosophy. Thus when Dewey supported World War I  in "the name of democracy," was this failure in practice a limit to pragmatism? Pragmatism today, argues Stuhr, must criticize practices that undermine and stunt the practice of genuinely democratic ways of life. It must fashion and articulate a 'new Americanism' which opposes prevailing colonialisms and partisanships and opposes liberal orders founded on military and global business coalitions. Dewey's notion of democracy as a way of life must be reinstated and distinguished from a fixed, sanctified form of a state that has adopted a policy of exporting American democracy. Is democracy a universal moral value for all peoples and what justification is there for thinking of democracy in this manner? Citizens need to be educated for democracy and new and effective communication venues must be established.

Chapter 9 addresses the claim that "war is normal," that a warlike attitude is ingrained in human nature. As James argued, we must seek moral equivalents of war and, as Addams advocated, promote ideals of peace. Ethical absolutes, and an ethics of hierarchy and rank must be overcome and the view that everything will be made different by war and triumph must be rejected. What is needed also, argues Stuhr, is Royce's 'wise provincialism,' "a provincialism of self-respect but not boasting, of openness and toleration and plasticity, and of wide knowledge and experiences of others." One must cultivate Royce's 'loyalty to loyalty.'

Then there is 'absurd pragmatism,' which counsels 'naturalistic honesty,' that of Sisyphus recognizing that his fate belongs to him and that the sun comes up and we start again. One must not elude one's life or destiny, but rather one must transform it and make it one's own.

Stuhr fashions a first-person, expressive philosophy which is pluralistic, dynamic, perspectival, social, relational, fallible, democratic and this-worldly. He provides us a persuasive narrative which convinces us that the old way of doing philosophy, the old and current way of conceiving democracy, the current way of living our lives are no longer viable in a post-wisdom age. The love of war, the arrogance, and intolerance that infect this time is wrecking many lives. Pragmatist meliorism demands that we give concerted effort to self and cultural transformation.

The criticisms of philosophy, democracy, and war and the plea for cultural transformation are compelling. However, the claim that relativistic ethics functions similarly to relativity in physics stretches Einstein's perspectival view of space and time. What in ethics functions as the platform which establishes the relativity of motion? Democracy as 'a way of life' needs a stronger persuasive narrative, and contestation may be inescapable in light of the inequalities of life, income, freedom, respect that exist today. 'Americanism,' 'hard work' and 'striving' need critical analysis, as does absurd pragmatism. How to imaginatively and critically engage other philosophies while also promoting cultural transformation needs development through a more persuasive narrative.