Pragmatism, Pluralism, and the Nature of Philosophy

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Scott F. Aikin and Robert B. Talisse, Pragmatism, Pluralism, and the Nature of Philosophy, Routledge, 2018, 262 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9780415793551.

Reviewed by Alexander Klein, California State University Long Beach


At the core of this book are a philosophical idea and a bitter inter-personal rivalry. The idea is compelling and worth exploring; the inter-personal rivalry is not. Let me explain.

In 2005 Aikin and Talisse published a provocative article called "Why Pragmatists Cannot Be Pluralists". Their main argument is repeated and improved upon in chapter 10 of their new book. They begin by characterizing value pluralism as the view that there is no single source of value (such as human happiness or flourishing or whatever), and that as a result some rival goods will be inherently incommensurable. "One implication of pluralism," they then point out, "is that there can be conflicts among values that do not admit of a uniquely rational resolution" (171). Next, they claim that all varieties of pragmatism are (or should be) at least committed to the view that any well-formed inquiry is in principle rationally resolvable. They conclude that value pluralism is inconsistent with pragmatism.

The argument is interesting because some classically pragmatist treatments of value do seem, at least on the surface, to adopt value pluralism (e.g., see James 1897/1979, 153; James is a favorite target of the authors). There are potential ways James or other pragmatists could deal with the apparent tension. But the authors' argument points at two threads in a good deal of pragmatist writing that really do pull in opposite directions -- an intention to take seriously the sheer and sometimes inscrutable diversity of human values, and a tendency to construe all inquiry as inevitably converging (perhaps through scientific reasoning methods) on maximally rational consensus, in the long run. Their argument exposes this tension in a particularly clear and incisive way.

This brings us to the inter-personal rivalry. The 2005 essay elicited a remarkable volume of hostile responses especially from members of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy (SAAP). The word "pluralism" has become a familiar watchword for those who see themselves as outside the "mainstream" of analytic philosophy, and indeed SAAP's own journal is called "The Pluralist." So, the contention that the dominant philosophical tradition at SAAP (pragmatism) is actually incompatible with anything worth calling "pluralism" is not just a clever argument; it is also a carefully sharpened stick in the eye. The authors call the group they are attacking "neoclassical pragmatists" (2-5), and it seems clear that they largely have in mind pragmatists active at SAAP.

Neoclassicists are accused of practicing a kind of back-to-the-classics reactionism that refuses to engage in open philosophical dialogue (i.e., in dialectical argument with non-pragmatists, 5). This reactionism has a purported theoretical source in neoclassicists' own metaphilosophical commitments. Aikin and Talisse define a "metaphilosophy" as any set of strictures that address both "how to do philosophy" and "what we can expect" philosophy to achieve (135). There is a danger of committing oneself to a too narrow metaphilosophy, they point out, for this can make it impossible to engage rationally in first-order philosophical debate with those who do not share one's second-order commitments. The authors give this danger the name "metaphilosophical creep" (ch. 8), and suggest that it is a problem to which neoclassical pragmatists are particularly prone.

This variety of "creep" has culminated in a virulent form of "triumphalism" among neoclassicists that involves portraying their own work as the "culmination of the history of philosophy" (117), on the authors' telling. If one refuses to accept potential rivals to one's own first-order views as genuinely philosophical (because those views are not countenanced by one's own strict metaphilosophy), then triumphalism is the natural outcome. Let's call metaphysical creep and triumphalism the "twin sins" of which neoclassicists are accused of committing.

Much of the book is devoted to showing that these sins actually grow out of purported metaphilosophical commitments to be found in classic texts of James and Dewey, texts neoclassicists hold dear. James is charged with a romantic sort of psychologism that portrays philosophy as nothing but a clash of temperaments (139-140; more on this, below). Dewey is charged with dismissing most or all non-pragmatist philosophy as nothing but an institution dedicated to "protecting the interests and values of privileged cultural and economic groups" against the rise of "new knowledge" made possible by our modern, democratic, non-hierarchical social life (142).

Aikin and Talisse go into considerable detail on how these twin sins grow not just out of James and Dewey's own metaphilosophy (part 2), but also out of James's moral philosophy (chs. 5, 9), his will-to-believe doctrine (ch. 4; more on this below), and out of Dewey's suggestive but purportedly stunted political theory (ch. 6; also see 13, 14). Peirce (and to a lesser extent, William Clifford; ch.4) provides the authors with a basis for a more "minimal" (146-149), and therefore more defensible, metaphilosophy meant to set pragmatists on the right foot. In short, the authors fashion their own history of pragmatism as a way to criticize neoclassicists and to sketch an alternative, positive project.

The tactic is risky. It threatens to turn history into little more than a proxy war for some highly localized enmities. In this vein, perhaps the most telling quotation of the book does not come from Peirce, James, or Dewey, but from Robert Brandom, who is depicted as holding that we have an "obligation" to justify our own philosophical positions by rationally-reconstructing philosophical history. Brandom is quoted as asserting, "it is our job to rewrite the history so as to discover in it the revelations of what then retrospectively appears as an antecedent nature" (quoted on 124; italics original). The danger is that aggressively "rewriting" the history of pragmatism is unlikely to sway neoclassicists, who will simply reject the interpretations of James and Dewey on offer. And scholars who approach the classics with more interest in plain historical accuracy than in battling neoclassicists may find that some key interpretive claims lack either interpretive charity or the sort of contextual detail we have come to expect (in the broader profession) from our histories of philosophy. Here is an example.

The first Lecture of Pragmatism famously grouped philosophers according to two types of extreme temperaments: the tough-minded and the tender-minded (152). Aikin and Talisse rightly notice that James thinks most non-philosophers have "a hankering for the good things on both sides of the line" (James 1907/1975, 14, quoted on 152). This is right, so far as it goes. But since this kind of reflection on philosophical temperament is so unusual today, readers might then hope for some context -- they might wonder what James aimed to accomplish with this bit of psychological reflection, how it might have fit in with his wider philosophical project, who he might have been responding to, and so on. But instead of engaging these issues, Aikin and Talisse quickly slip into objection-mode:

Consider the obvious non-pragmatist response . . . that the pragmatist mixing of temperaments is a thinly disguised form of embracing contradictions. And James indeed provides critics with sufficient ammunition. He advocates 'free-will determinism' as the 'true philosophy,' and further, 'pluralistic monism,' and contends that thus 'practical pessimism may be combined with metaphysical optimism'. (154)

Aikin and Talisse here portray James as knowingly advocating both P and ~P. They go on to explain this strange situation by suggesting that to James, "philosophical theses don't matter as views, but only as expressions of temperament" (155). Readers should find it hard to believe that James embraced logical contradictions, or that he saw first-order philosophical views as nothing but temperamental excrescences, which therefore are not to be engaged rationally. But instead of properly documenting this damning reading or helping the reader make sense of why James might have been driven to such an extreme, the authors are content to offer a few of these quotation-snippets, and then to dismiss James's brand of pragmatism.

The problem is that these quotation-snippets (taken from James 1907/1975, 14-15) are drastically distorted. What James actually says is that "your ordinary philosophic layman," who never bothers "straightening out his system," might be happy with "free-will determinism" and so on. But "some of us are more than mere laymen in philosophy," he writes, and those who are "more than mere laymen . . . cannot preserve a good intellectual conscience so long as we keep mixing incompatibles from opposite sides of the line." The rest of Pragmatism is aimed at this person who is more rigorous than "your ordinary philosophic layman" -- at the person who is "unwilling to mix a hodge-podge system," in James's words (my italics). So, the authors' Brandom-inspired, historical "rewriting" often aims at hanging an albatross around their opponent's neck; but the approach is too prone to sacrificing accuracy, context, and charity.

What is more, despite their laudable goal of encouraging rigorous argument among pragmatists, sometimes Aikin and Talisse themselves offer criticisms that turn on outright logical fallacy. Consider their analysis of "The Will to Believe." They say that the "core" of that essay's central argument is a principle that they formulate as follows:

WTB: If S faces an option that is (i) genuine, (ii) rationally undecidable, and (iii) has a morally preferable outcome that is doxastically efficacious, then S may (perhaps must) decide on the basis of S's passional nature for the morally preferable and efficacious hypothesis. (63 -- the roman numerals are my addition)

Their phrase "doxastically efficacious" characterizes a special type of belief-option (such as the choice to believe in one's own ability to leap across a chasm) where an agent's acceptance of the belief itself causally contributes to the belief's turning out to be true. Now, the authors portray WTB as the crucial premise in (what they see as) James's "central argument" for the view that religious faith is a "lawful exception" to Cliffordian evidentialism (63) -- to the view that "it is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything on insufficient evidence."

They see James as motivating WTB by appealing to the courtship of both friends and lovers, where sometimes the confident belief that a prospective friend (or lover) will like me actually helps bring about the truth of this proposition. James really did suggest that this kind of confident, courtly attitude could causally contribute to the eventual truth of some relationship-beliefs. And Aikin and Talisse rightly point out that some of his discussion is repugnant by today's standards (e.g.: "How many women's hearts are vanquished by the mere sanguine insistence of some man that they must love him! he will not consent to the hypothesis that they cannot," 1897/1979, 28). The authors spend several pages declaring this attitude "deeply objectionable" (69), and "more than a little slimy" (70). They assert that James is giving us "advice" on "attracting lovers" that is "patently ridiculous, bordering on an endorsement of harassing behavior" (p. 70). James's words reflect, they worry, "the belief[s] of a stalker and abuser" (71).

The point of this litany is to suggest that "a friendship founded on" the kind of confidence James entertains is unlikely to "run deep or persist" (71). But that is to say that in the "slimy" cases where I aggressively press my belief that you like me, there is a straightforward failure of doxastic efficacy. After all, what Aikin and Talisse are rightly denying is that the tactics of "a stalker and abuser" actually lead to genuine friendships or romances at all.

The problem is that cases where doxastic efficacy fails cannot constitute counter-examples to WTB, but rather are just cases where the antecedent of that principle fails to obtain. Specifically, "slimy" beliefs about prospective relationships fail to meet condition (iii) because those are cases where one's belief is not going to be doxastically efficacious (or, for that matter, to be morally preferable). Such examples are thus irrelevant to the soundness of James's argument (as the authors construe it) for the permissibility of religious belief.

Consider the following conditional, which has the same logical form as WTB:

CYCLONE: if (i) water temperature is above 27 degrees Celsius, (ii) at least 345 miles from the equator, and (iii) wind shear is low, then a tropical cyclone will form.[1]

On Aikin and Talisse's reasoning, we should reject this principle if we find that tropical cyclones fail to occur around water that exceeds 27 degrees, is more than 345 miles from the equator, under conditions where wind shear is high. Obviously, that kind of finding plainly wouldn't warrant throwing out the CYCLONE principle. So, finding that there are cases where subjects face options that are (i) genuine, (ii) rationally undecidable, and (iii) that lack a morally preferable outcome that is doxastically efficacious also does not warrant throwing out WTB.

Let me conclude on a positive note. The tactic of "rewriting" the history of pragmatism as a way to attack neoclassical pragmatists is largely carried out in parts 1 and 2. For this reviewer, part 3 arrives like fresh air. There, Aikin and Talisse largely turn their attention away from neoclassicists and offer some genuine insights. They develop a compelling, loosely Deweyan conception of deliberative democracy (ch. 14). They also develop some provocative objections to Price's global expressivism (ch. 12), and to Kitcher's Science, Truth, and Democracy (ch. 11). And they raise a serious and important complaint about pragmatist political philosophy (in ch. 13): that it has failed to be sufficiently attentive to the role of justice in democratic society. There is also some helpful material earlier in the book that deals with Peirce on his own terms (rather than as a figure to be recruited in the fight against neoclassicists), portraying him as an epistemic infinitist (ch. 3) and offering a novel reading of his "Fixation of Belief" (ch. 4).

Neoclassicists are accused of being unwilling to engage rationally opponents who do not share their strict metaphilosophy. Much of this book is dedicated to making explicit and then criticizing that strict metaphilosophy. Whether that attack is successful as a matter of polemic is for others, who are actually party to the acrimony, to judge. What is of more general philosophical interest and value, in my judgment, is the material where Peirce is engaged on his own terms, and especially where Aikin and Talisse themselves look outwards and engage philosophical work that is not so enmeshed in the altercation over pragmatism and pluralism. I hope their future work continues to pursue this outward-looking stance.


James, William. 1897/1979. The Will to Believe, and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy. Edited by Frederick H. Burkhardt, Fredson Bowers and Ignas K. Skrupskelis. Harvard University Press.

James, William. 1907/1975. Pragmatism. Edited by Fredson Bowers and Ignas K. Skrupskelis. Harvard University Press.

Talisse, Robert B., and Scott F. Aikin. 2005. "Why Pragmatists Cannot Be Pluralists." Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society 41 (1):101-118.

[1] This toy example is adapted from Elizabeth Hannigan's "What Are the Three Weather Conditions Under Which a Tropical Cyclone Usually Develops?".