Prejudice: A Study in Non-Ideal Epistemology

Prejudice A Study In Non Ideal Epistemology

Endre Begby, Prejudice: A Study in Non-Ideal Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2021, 218pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198852834.

Reviewed by Robin McKenna, University of Liverpool


Prejudice is bad and prejudiced believers are bad believers. Or so goes the common prejudice. We can all agree that prejudice is morally bad. But in his new book Endre Begby argues that it is not clear that prejudice is bad from an epistemic point of view. His thesis is that, while prejudiced beliefs are usually (or even always) false, prejudiced believers may be justified in believing as they do (8). While this is a provocative thesis, what follows? One strength of Begby’s book is that it combines sophisticated epistemology with a nuanced account of responsibility for prejudice and for the moral harms and wrongs that can result from it. On this account, if their prejudiced beliefs are justified, we cannot morally blame a prejudiced believer for having them, or for any harms and wrongs that result. But we can still hold them morally liable for these harms and wrong. Begby therefore defends a picture on which epistemic and moral evaluation are related but importantly distinct. Specifically, you can do something that is morally wrong—indeed, something for which you can be held morally responsible in the sense of liable—yet be entirely epistemically justified in having the beliefs that led you to act as you did.

This is a well-written and thought-provoking book. It is both philosophically sophisticated and relatively accessible. Advanced students with some background in relevant areas should have no trouble following the broad outline of the argument. Researchers interested in the topics it covers (and it covers quite a few) will gain a lot from reading it. Some of them will find things to disagree with, but that is only to be expected. All told, this is a sophisticated and nuanced account of the epistemology and ethics of prejudice and prejudiced belief.

Let me give a brief overview of each chapter. The book can be split into three parts. In the first part (Chapters one, two, and three), Begby deals with some preliminaries. In Chapter one, he clarifies the epistemological assumptions he relies on throughout the book. Basically: some form of evidentialism is correct, though the form of evidentialism he endorses is not internalist (at least in the traditional sense[1]), and is probably consistent with popular views linking evidence with knowledge.

Chapter one also provides a working definition of prejudice according to which prejudices are negatively charged stereotypes targeting some group of people and (though only derivatively) individuals who are members of the relevant group. Chapter two then situates this definition within contemporary psychological work on prejudice. In this chapter Begby also argues that, given the kinds of creatures we are, we cannot but rely on prejudices and stereotypes.

Chapter three introduces what Begby calls a “non-ideal” approach to epistemology. The idea is that we need to recognise the respects in which our epistemic situation is less than ideal. In particular, we need to recognise our cognitive limitations (“endogenous non-ideality”) and the extent to which our “information environment” is imperfect (“exogenous non-ideality”). While most of us have the same cognitive limitations, some of us inhabit worse information environments than others. This is important because, at least on Begby’s evidentialist account of justification, a belief that would be unjustified in a good information environment may well be justified in a bad information environment—and vice versa.

In the second part (Chapters four, five, six, and seven), Begby develops his argument that prejudiced beliefs can be justified. Chapter four argues that prejudiced beliefs can be justified at the point of acquisition. The idea is that prejudiced belief can result from human cognitive systems working as they are supposed to, at least in the environments in which they usually operate. Imagine Jonny, who observes that most of the students in his maths class are boys, and who is frequently told that boys are better at maths than girls by people in positions of authority, such as teachers. Begby argues that, given the evidence at his disposal, Jonny may be justified in forming the belief that boys are better at maths than girls. Of course, we might wish he had different, better evidence. But that’s not to say that the belief he forms, on the basis of the evidence he in fact has, is unjustified.

Chapter five argues that prejudiced beliefs can remain justified even in the face of contrary evidence. Begby argues that, once you have a prejudiced belief, it can exert an influence over how you interpret new evidence that speaks against that prejudiced belief. It may be that, because you already have the prejudiced belief, you reject evidence against it that you would otherwise have taken on board. But this is not surprising because, in general, our beliefs exert this sort of influence over how we interpret new evidence. Further, you may be entirely justified in rejecting new evidence on the basis of your existing beliefs. What you are justified in believing depends on the evidence at your disposal and it is hard to see why a prejudiced believer could never have evidence at their disposal such that they are justified in holding on to their prejudiced beliefs in the face of contrary evidence.

Chapter six develops this line of thought by introducing what Begby calls “evidential preemption”. The idea is that testimony that p can be accompanied by (explicit or implicit) instructions to discount future testimony against p. But, argues Begby, if you are justified in accepting the testimony that p, presumably you are (usually) also justified in accepting the accompanying testimony that those who will tell you otherwise are not to be trusted. The result is that prejudiced beliefs may be “inoculated” against contrary evidence. Begby suggests that evidential preemption might be useful in thinking about a range of phenomena including conspiracy theories and fake news.

Chapter seven argues that prejudices can “shape” social interactions even if few people actually believe them. The thought is that prejudices provide “social scripts” that help us anticipate how others will act (and figure out how we should act!). Crucially, there are incentives to follow these scripts (if you don’t you might get punished), so it may be that people follow them even though they don’t endorse them. The result is that you may get prejudiced behaviour without prejudiced belief.

In the third and final part, Begby shifts his focus from epistemology to ethics (Chapters eight, nine, and ten). His main aim is to argue that there is a tension between our epistemic and moral ideals. Epistemically speaking, we want to hold beliefs that are supported by the evidence. Morally speaking, we want to avoid wronging others and causing (unnecessary) harm. But, Begby argues, you can believe in accordance with the evidence yet still wrong others and cause real harm. Consequently, it may well be impossible to satisfy our epistemic and moral ideals simultaneously.

Chapter eight illustrates this general idea via a concrete example: the use of automated risk assessments in criminal sentencing (roughly, these are assessments of an offender’s risk of re-offending given certain demographic data about them). Begby argues that it is hard to see what is epistemically wrong with relying on such data—especially given that the alternative is to rely on far less reliable human judgement. The problem is that the results of relying on automated risk assessments are manifestly unjust because white offenders are more likely to receive lenient (in the US context!) sentences than black offenders.

Chapter nine examines a line of resistance to Begby’s claim that there is a tension between the requirements of epistemology and morality. Some have argued that there are moral constraints on belief: roughly, the more “morally charged” a situation, the stricter the epistemic requirements on belief (i.e., the more evidence required for the belief to be justified).  The thought is that the “encroachment” of moral constraints on epistemic requirements will ensure that any belief that is likely to wrong someone is thereby unjustified. Against this Begby argues that, even granting that moral constraints can encroach on epistemic requirements in this way, it is hard to see how you could not have a body of evidence that is sufficiently strong to justify a belief that might wrong someone when translated into action.

Chapter ten develops an account of moral responsibility for prejudice. Begby draws a distinction between moral blame and moral liability. While you can’t be morally blamed for any wrongs that result from your (justified) prejudiced beliefs, you can still be held liable for those wrongs. This goes against the idea, which Begby attributes to Miranda Fricker (2007), among others, that the moral wrong of prejudice is grounded in the “epistemic wrong” of prejudiced belief. For Begby, whether prejudiced beliefs are justified or not is irrelevant to whether they wrong those whom they target.

Let me now raise some concerns about Begby’s main claims. I am largely in agreement with his account of moral responsibility for prejudice. But what about the epistemology of prejudice that Begby develops in the first two parts of the book? We can start with the claim that prejudiced beliefs may well be justified. Begby’s defence of this claim makes use of epistemological assumptions that some will find problematic. I want to highlight two of them. First, he subscribes to a (sophisticated) form of evidentialism according to which a belief is justified if and to the extent that it is supported by the evidence that the believer has (or should have) at their disposal. He therefore rejects the competing truth- (or knowledge-) centred approach, on which to say that a class of beliefs is, like prejudiced beliefs, almost uniformly false is essentially to say that they are unjustified.

While defenders of truth- (and knowledge-) centred approaches will no doubt take issue with this, in my view they would do well to acknowledge Begby’s point that we need to make space for a kind of positive epistemic status that attaches to beliefs that are supported by the available evidence. As Begby argues, it will not do to equate this status with blamelessness. You may blamelessly fail to believe in accordance with the available evidence due to fatigue, or something of the sort. But your belief is not thereby justified.

Second, Begby’s approach to the theory of justification is informed by his non-ideal approach to epistemology. His thought is that theory of justification must respect human cognitive limitations and the imperfect information environments in which humans find themselves. While I am in full agreement with the importance of recognising these dimensions of non-ideality, I was a little unsure whether it is as novel or unusual as he sometimes suggests it is. I would have thought that any broadly naturalist approach to justification must respect both our cognitive limitations and the nature of our “epistemic environments”. Take, for example, the sort of reliabilist epistemology defended by Hilary Kornblith (2021).

Begby’s use of the label “non-ideal epistemology” is also liable to mislead. Those who claim to take a “non-ideal” approach to epistemology (people like José Medina, or Charles Mills) tend to either be working within the tradition of feminist epistemology, specifically feminist standpoint theory (Medina 2012) or have something analogous to non-ideal theory in political philosophy in mind (Mills 2007). But Begby says at the outset that he is not working within the tradition of feminist standpoint theory (7–8). Further, while he clearly is doing something akin to non-ideal theory in the parts of the book that focus on ethics, Begby sharply distinguishes between this and epistemology, whether non-ideal or not.

This might not seem a substantive point. And in some ways, it isn’t—what matters is that non-ideal work on prejudice is done, not whether we call it “non-ideal epistemology” or something else. But there are two reasons why it might matter. The first is that Begby’s approach might still be a little too ideal. His aim is not so much to show that prejudiced beliefs are often justified as to show that there are certain conditions under which prejudiced beliefs would be justified (and that these conditions will sometimes be met). It is therefore unclear what implications his arguments have for someone like Mills, who is interested in actual prejudiced belief, and more broadly in various forms of racialised ignorance as they exist in the contemporary US and other countries. To be sure, much of what Begby says could have been marshalled in the service of arguing that, as a matter of fact, many actual prejudiced believers have justified beliefs. But he does not himself take this step.[2]

The second is that, at least so far as the epistemology of prejudice is concerned, Begby’s approach is strikingly individualistic. (This is not to say that the book in general is too focused on individuals: several of the later chapters address the issue of prejudice from a more structural and institutional perspective). His question is whether individual agents may have justified prejudiced beliefs given the evidence they have (or should have) at their disposal. While Begby inherits this individualistic focus from the epistemological tradition he is criticising, it is worth pointing out that one can take an interest in the epistemic evaluation of groups (cf. “group epistemology”). In particular, one might wonder whether Mills’ work on group ignorance is not best considered through this lens. On might also wonder whether group-based forms of ignorance like white ignorance are best understood in a summative way.

Even if one is interested in the epistemic evaluation of individuals and their beliefs, there are traditions that are less evidentialist, like reliabilism. There is some sense to the idea that there is something wrong with a believer that is so situated that their beliefs—at least within a more or less narrowly circumscribed domain—are largely false. There is also sense to the idea that there is something wrong with the beliefs themselves. Just as it would be a mistake to ignore the evidentialist dimension of epistemic evaluation, it would be a mistake to ignore this more external dimension. This is particularly important from the point of view of phenomena like white ignorance. If—to take one of Mills’ examples—a society suffers from collective amnesia about a past genocide then it may well be that many of its members have false beliefs about the past that are justified by the evidentialist’s lights. But they are hardly thereby immune from epistemic criticism.


Fricker, Miranda (2007). Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kornblith, Hilary (2021). Scientific Epistemology: An Introduction. New York: Oxford University Press.

Medina, José (2012). The Epistemology of Resistance. New York: Oxford University Press.

Mills, Charles (2007). White Ignorance. In Shannon Sullivan & Nancy Tuana (eds.), Race and Epistemologies of Ignorance. Albany: State University of New York Press: 11–38.


[1] That is: the sense in which one has to endorse some sort of claim about the supervenience of justification on internal non-factive states of the individual believer in order to be an internalist.

[2] It is perhaps worth noting that Begby argues that the difficulty with looking at actual prejudiced beliefs is that we are often not in a position to determine whether they are justified because we don’t have access to the relevant information (see p.12 n.10 and p.62 n.3). But this is, in part, a consequence of the sort of theory of justification Begby favours. From a more externalist perspective, we can criticise prejudiced beliefs on the simple grounds that they are (often) false.