Primary and Secondary Qualities: The Historical and Ongoing Debate

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Lawrence Nolan (ed.), Primary and Secondary Qualities: The Historical and Ongoing Debate, Oxford University Press, 2011, 404pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556151.

Reviewed by Michael Jacovides, Purdue University


Primary and Secondary Qualities: The Historical and Ongoing Debate is a first-rate collection of papers. The editor, Lawrence Nolan, did a terrific job selecting authors, and he has impressive persuasive powers. For the twelve historical papers, Nolan must have succeeded in getting his first or second choice in almost every case and the two non-historical papers are written by three very good metaphysicians. The first two contributions are on primary and secondary qualities in ancient philosophy and scholasticism. There's also one paper on Gassendi, two papers on Descartes (one of which also discusses Boyle), two papers on Locke, one paper on Leibniz, two papers on Hume, one paper on Reid, and one paper that treats Kant and Helmholtz. Of the final two papers, one defends an error theory about colors and the other argues that colors aren't dispositions.

Here are four things that one might want from an account of primary and secondary qualities: first, a chemical account of the qualities, insofar as that is possible; second, a bit of philosophy of mind to account for uniform appearances of qualities which have diverging underlying structures. Third, in light of the relevant chemical and phenomenological facts, we'd like a metaphysical account of what the qualities are and where they reside. Finally, it would be nice to have a semantics for primary and secondary quality judgments. How, given the metaphysical landscape, can we make sense of the verbal behavior of rational speakers operating under the maxim of truth? The book is arranged chronologically, but I'll organize my review around these desiderata, even though this entails some skipping back and forth between papers.


Mi-Kyoung Lee's contribution, entitled "The Distinction between Primary and Secondary Qualities in Ancient Greek Philosophy," is especially good in explaining the difficulties of her assigned project. Ancient philosophers had theories about the essential and inseparable features of matter and they had theories of mind-dependent qualities, but they didn't treat these two topics as coordinated. Having drawn this distinction, she summarizes ancient accounts of matter, quickly for the true pre-Socratics, and with a bit more leisure for Democritus, Plato, and Aristotle.

Robert Pasnau's work is outstanding for the breadth and depth of his scholarship, and his contribution ("Scholastic Qualities, Primary and Secondary") is a representative slice of that scholarship. Both his paper and Lee's bring out a kind of continuity between early modern thought and its predecessors by translating terms that are normally translated out of Greek and Latin as 'first' and 'second qualities' as 'primary' and 'secondary qualities.' From this point of view, primary qualities are fundamentally explanatory chemical qualities and secondary qualities are qualities derived from them. On this account, the relevant transformation in the early modern period wasn't a conceptual innovation but rather a substantive change of doctrine about what the fundamental explanatory qualities were.

Antonia LoLordo's contribution nicely brings out the metaphysical significance of explanatory chemical qualities. She asks whether and why Gassendi believed that various qualities such as cold, heat, and color were mind-dependent in any interesting way. She concludes that he concludes that they aren't. Since qualities such as cold and heat have effects, they must be objective. The paper combines the proficiency in Latin required to make sense of these many out-of-the-way texts with the metaphysical sophistication required to make sense of Gassendi's subtle distinctions. It's also a reminder of the objective pull of chemical explanation. Qualities that have mind-independent explanatory power ought not be relegated to the mind.

Edwin McCann distinguishes what he calls 'primary primary qualities' (primary qualities as they inhere in imperceptibly small bodies) and 'secondary primary qualities' (primary qualities as they inhere in perceptible bodies). He then suggests that we interpret Locke's resemblance thesis as asserting that ideas of primary primary qualities represent something similar to secondary primary qualities and ideas of secondary qualities do not. This reading is clever and original, and, whether or not it captures Locke's meaning in his various formulations of the resemblance thesis, it expresses something that Locke believes. McCann's paper moves in an odd direction at the end. He argues that Locke has so little confidence in corpuscularianism that he doesn't even think that it's a valuable theory for hypothetical illustrative purposes. This contradicts other things that Locke said and other things that McCann has said, including, it seems to me, the reading that he develops in the first half of his paper.

Michael Ayers's magisterial paper is an exercise in rational reconstruction. He argues that Locke's way of presenting his account of primary qualities leaves him hostage to the fickleness of science. (In a related spirit, Lisa Downing disparages Descartes's appeals to Ockham's razor in eliminating sensible qualities since he didn't manage to develop a true and adequate physics.) Ayers develops a purified, commonsensical account of primary qualities as those that belong to our ordinary conception of bodies. His account ought to be understood as an auxiliary to the attractive metaphysical treatment of substances as coherent hunks that Ayers developed in Locke: Epistemology & Ontology.

Philosophy of Mind

According to the scholastics, knowledge is through similitudes. Pasnau observes that they hardly ever worry about the character of phenomenal experience, and he argues that, for the most part, their talk of similarity between object and knower ought not to be taken literally.

It seems to me that if you heed Pasnau's first observation, then you can neglect his interpretive advice. I've always liked Sheldon Cohen's reading of Aquinas, according to which the relevant similitudes are little images inhering in the jelly of the eye, and which you can see when you look at your reflection in someone's eye.[1] Warmth is perceived in a living hand by the hand becoming warm. It's true that visual qualities inhere in the eyes 'intentionally,' but that isn't supposed to be a distinctively mental inherence, since sensible species also inhere in the air intentionally. Intentional inherence was supposed to be just the temporary way of bearing colors that transparent objects (air, eyes, puddles) have when illuminated.

Pasnau grants that some scholastics took resemblance literally, and I'll grant that some of them didn't, so any remaining dispute is just a matter of what particular philosophers meant by particular expressions in particular texts. I do want to push back a bit against one of his reasons for thinking that the scholastics generally didn't take their similarities literally. As he observes, they held that resemblances are involved not just in our grasp of sensible species, but also in our grasp of substantial species, such as badger and juniper. But we need to take resemblance in such contexts literally as well, or we won't be able to understand one of scholasticism's favorite arguments, Aristotle's argument for the immateriality of mind. In De Anima 3.4-5 Aristotle argues that since the faculties of mind and sense perception both work by receiving forms, the mind has to be unmixed with body. If it were material, then when we thought of a stone, there would be a stone in the mind, in the same way that our sense organs become warm or cold when they sense something warm or cold. The argument makes no sense if we don't take the relevant sameness of forms as literal qualitative similarity, especially with respect to our sense organs.

Literal resemblance between perceiver and thing perceived only became deeply problematic with Descartes's invention of Cartesian dualism and with his doctrine that perceptions of sensible qualities are sensations that inhere in an unextended substratum. In his contribution, "Descartes on 'What We Call Color'," Nolan observes that Descartes sometimes uses color terms to refer to structures in bodies, and he sometimes uses them to refer to sensations of color. He warns against taking the first references too seriously since Descartes isn't engaging in metaphysics there, and he warns against taking the second references too seriously because Descartes doesn't really believe in color sensations except as illegitimate abstractions. I'm sympathetic to some of the complaints that Nolan launches against color sensations, but I don't think that he's said enough to project his unhappiness onto Descartes. Likewise, I share some of Alan Nelson and David Landy's skepticism about the phenomenological primacy of simple ideas of color, but I don't think that they say enough in their contribution, "Qualities and Simple Ideas: Hume and his Debt to Berkeley," to justify supposing that Hume was skeptical as well.


Lisa Downing's fine contribution, "Sensible Qualities and Material Bodies in Descartes and Boyle," gets at some of the deepest issues in Descartes's metaphysics and epistemology. She reconstructs three arguments that he might offer in defense of his thesis that our ideas of sensible qualities don't represent anything in bodies: first, because on inspection it turns out that they don't represent anything at all; second, because we can't manage to conceive of how these qualities inhere in bodies; and, third, because we can't conceive of these qualities as determinations of the essence of bodies. Downing argues that these arguments aren't sound. Her evaluations are fair, reasonable, and, I think, right, but they aren't obviously right. I can imagine someone reading her paper and deciding to take up the mantle of Cartesian metaphysics. She appends a discussion of Boyle on sensible qualities which is good but not as deep.

As Martha Brandt Bolton explains, Leibniz was a committed mechanist, but he also thought that forces were prior to primary qualities and that the reality of bodies depended upon monads. Her account of his treatment of primary and secondary qualities is clear, well informed, and convincing, at least as convincing as a substantial discussion of such controverted topics can be. Kenneth Winkler's paper on Hume is knowledgeable and sympathetic, though his sympathy doesn't trick him into getting fooled by poor arguments. His paper is an exercise in domesticating Hume's thought. On the face of it, Hume assimilates ideas of primary and secondary qualities in a way that's either aporetic or idealistic. Winkler, however, is primarily concerned with whether the distinction can be reconstructed using Humean materials. He's also interested in figuring out how early modern thinkers distinguished between sensible qualities and secondary qualities. It's one of the pleasures of a volume like this that the reader can illuminate Winkler's puzzle by appealing to Lee's earlier discussion of these ancient concepts.

James Van Cleve's paper engages recent controversies over Reid's intentions in his treatment of primary and secondary qualities. Reid sometimes says that secondary qualities are powers, he sometimes says that they are unknown causes of known effects, and he sometimes says that the main part of our notion of secondary qualities is that they bring about sensations. Van Cleve concludes that Reid thinks of secondary qualities as dispositions to produce sensations and the relevant unknown cause is the categorical base of that disposition, which seems like a reasonable interpretation. Van Cleve also argues that Reid's theory is incompatible with common sense, since Reid denies that 'sensuous color' exists in the external world.

Gary Hatfield's discussion of Kant is primarily concerned with explaining Kant's appeals to the distinction between primary and secondary qualities to explain transcendental idealism. In the Prolegomena, Kant says his version of idealism isn't so shocking, since he's just asserting about primary qualities what was uncontroversial about secondary qualities; in the Critique, he warns against assimilating the ideality of space to the subjectivity of colors, tastes, and the like. Like Bolton's paper on Leibniz, Hatfield's is judicious, well informed, and treats highly disputed matters convincingly. Hatfield then adds a discussion of Helmholtz on secondary qualities which presents a nice slice of history from the intellectual life of the great physicist and experimental psychologist.

Alex Byrne and David Hilbert's contribution is a bit of a hodge-podge. First they argue against certain circularity objections against dispositionalism; then they offer some arguments against some varieties of reductive dispositionalism. They argue that current neuroscience doesn't presuppose dispositionalism, argue against two arguments in favor of non-reductive dispositionalism, and finally conclude by saying that the problem with dispositionalism is not that it's false but that it's trivial. There's really too much going on in this paper for any part of it to be entirely persuasive, but it does offer a lot of food for thought.


Lee aptly points to Plato's development of Protagoras's semantics. As the Theaetetus shows, the doctrine that things are as they appear is especially plausible for taste, heat, and color. At the other extreme, perhaps, Democritus had written, "by convention (nomos) sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color; but in reality atoms and void." There's an ancient debate about whether he meant to deny that anything actually is sweet, bitter, hot, or colored, or whether he meant that sweet, bitter, and hot were mind-relative qualities that are as they appear. Lee argues that Democritus doesn't really think that such judgments are false, but she grants to her opponents, ancient and modern, that he must not have been entirely clear on the topic.

In Barry Maund's clearly written and argued defense of an error theory of color, the conclusion follows from the premises. He first asserts that certain doctrines are part of the concept of color and that if they aren't satisfied, there aren't any colors. He then shows that they aren't satisfied. After concluding that there are no colors, he offers a fictionalist account of colors for our future practical purposes. It seems to me that the irreducible core of the concept of color is what the toddler knows when she knows her colors, which doesn't come with much baggage. Maund gestures at the minimalistic account of the concept of color by calling it a 'recognitional concept' but he adds elements to this foundation until nothing counts as red. If he could increase his toleration for vagueness and learn to live with a leaner concept of color, he could use his replacement fictionalist account as a positive account of what it is to be colored.

* * * * * *

Everybody working on primary and secondary qualities ought to read this book. I also recommend it for anyone working on early modern metaphysics and epistemology. The best papers are excellent, and even the lesser papers are interesting, provocative and pretty good. Nolan and Oxford should be congratulated on a job well done.[2]

[1] "St. Thomas Aquinas on the Immaterial Reception of Sensible Forms," The Philosophical Review (1982) 91: 193-209.

[2] I'm grateful to Jeff Brower for very helpful comments.