Probability in the Philosophy of Religion

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Jake Chandler and Victoria S. Harrison (eds.), Probability in the Philosophy of Religion, Oxford University Press, 2012, 272pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199604760.

Reviewed by Trent Dougherty, Baylor University


The book opens with an uncommonly helpful introduction that will prove very useful to the relatively uninitiated. The introduction also contains nice guides to the included papers. The following chapters are organized into five topical parts.

Part I is "Testimony and Miracles". In "Peirce on Miracles: The Failure of Bayesian Analysis", Benjamin Jantzen unsurprisingly advocates an abductive approach, abjuring Bayes. In "The Reliability of Witness and Testimony to the Miraculous", Tim and Lydia McGrew take it back to Bayes, contra Condorcet. They show how the Bayesian can accommodate certain holistic instincts adverted to by Jantzen's chapter. In "Does it Matter whether a Miracle-like Event Happens to Oneself rather than to Someone Else?", Bovens answers, against Alston, "Yes" to his titular question, and while I must concur, I must also add "not much" in the relevant kinds of cases. Think about it: a very reliable friend tells you she was abducted by aliens. This will make you worry, but it had also better make you wonder. If no (further) signs of cognitive malfunction are forthcoming, the ball is in your court. And, of course, if one is, as most are, antecedently convinced of supernaturalism, reports of miracles will not, mirabile dictu be as eccentric as ET. Taken as a set, the essays in Part I show the very different roles that consideration of the personal reliability ratings of individuals might play.

Part II is "Design". In "Can Evidence for Design be Explained Away", David Glass (a lecturer in computer science, which is a nice addition) answers his titular question "Kinda sorta maybe, but not really" (there are a lot of variables) or, more accurately "it all depends". It depends on dependence in particular, on whether theism and "competing" hypotheses are independent. Glass rightly points out there is good reason to think they are not (multiverses call for explanation, too), so there is good reason to think that there is at least some residual confirmation of theism even in the cases in which the "competing" hypotheses are known to be true or strongly confirmed to be true (the exposition is generally crisp and clear but it would have been nice if he'd had room to run his cases using Jeffrey conditioning). In "Bayes, God, and the Multiverse" (Chapter 6) Richard Swinburne gives a very thorough treatment of the nature and significance of multiverse theorizing on the fine-tuning argument for the existence of God. His conclusion is similar to that of Glass:that even spotting multiverse theory a great deal -- for example being simpler than single-universe theory -- theism's margin of victory is not much less in the case of the multiverse than the single universe, since theism is still much simpler than multiverse theory, and multiverses which are fine-tuned enough to produce universes in the right range with the right frequency to make intelligent life probable themselves call for explanation. (After all, there are infinitely many models of infinite-universe-producing multiverses which just throw off infinitely many junk universes.)

Part III, "Evil", I will discuss in some detail below.

In Part IV, "Pascal's Wager", Alan Hájek returns to that argument he loves to hate in "Blaise and Bayes". Most of the issues he raises seem to be more general issues in decision theory and not essentially tied to Pascal's Wager. In some cases, his arguments very clearly depend on independent theses; for example, his argument against the regularity guideline many probabilists abide by: never assign 0 to any contingent proposition (or in my book, any proposition at all). He devotes a brief appendix just to this issue, but the arguments are syncopated and go by very quickly. The article is very well-organized, treats many options and objections, and engages Pascal's texts (not, in my opinion, with universal success). It is a delightful basket full of research projects for anyone interested in doing decision theory with infinite utilities. In "Many Gods, Many Wagers: Pascal's Wager meets the Replicator Dynamics", Paul Bartha does what really seems to need doing: generalizing decision theory to deal with the kinds of puzzles raised by cases of infinite utility. In such cases intuitive principles clash with standard decision rules. There should be a way to expand the mechanism to accommodate these intuitions. Bartha illustrates this research project in a way related to evolutionary game theory. It is just the right kind of paper to follow Hájek's.

Part V, "Faith and Disagreement", has one paper about faith and one about disagreement. In "Does Religious Disagreement Actually Aid the Case for Theism?", Joshua Thurow takes an approach to religious disagreement which, like Dougherty 2013, puts to work the distinction between foundational and derived justification and advocates a non-skeptical version of the Equal Weight View (roughly, giving just as much weight to the judgments of peers as to oneself (Dougherty 2013 generalizes this to near-peers)). Thurow looks at a special case of disagreement among peers where there is prior agreement about the implications of a subset of their total evidence. It amounts to a case where disagreement is a defeater defeater, in particular, an undercutting defeater of a rebutting defeater. He gives two interesting and plausible examples of how the case of religious belief might be like this. I've read reams of literature on the epistemological significance of disagreement, and this is one of the most creative and interesting I've seen (and all with appeal only to simple and intuitive ideas). That's the disagreement part of Part V, now for the Faith part.

The paper on faith is by Lara Buchak, a first-rate decision theorist, who brings her considerable technical acumen to bear on the question "Can it be Rational to have Faith?". She answers in the affirmative, but it is key to keep in mind that the question is not exactly what you might initially think. For example, on the one hand, she affirms that there is a "sense in which faith requires going beyond the evidence" (225) but, on the other hand, she also assumes "a broadly evidentialist conception of epistemic rationality" according to which "one should proportion one's beliefs to one's evidence" and "should not take non-truth-conducive reasons as reasons for belief" (235). So there is no worry about fideism here. Rather, as a good decision theorist who maintains a clear distinction between practical and theoretical rationality, she is aiming at characterizing acts of faith. And her aim is not just religious faith, but the attitude of faith in general.

Buchak's root notion is a relation between a proposition and an action. She phrases it "faith that X, expressed by A," (228) and the official analysans is "A person has faith that X, expressed by A when . . . " which makes it seem like the focus is on the proposition. But it seems to me it might just as well have been phrased "A is an act of faith for S with respect to X when . . . " At any rate, this leads to an account of "going beyond the evidence" with this consequence: "faith requires not engaging in an inquiry whose only purpose is to figure out the truth of the proposition one purportedly has faith in" (232-233). She is pretty serious about the "only" part: there are lots of reasons to inquire about a proposition that is an object of faith, which are not contrary to the nature of faith. Also, it's not merely turning a blind eye. It is best illustrated by the kind of case where you rightly trust your spouse and don't go looking for evidence that she is not cheating. The greatest shortcoming to this approach is that it doesn't take into account the fact that faith comes in degrees. "I have a lot of faith in that old truck." "I don't have much faith in that rope." This is important, for if I keep on getting evidence that my spouse is cheating, there is some finite amount of poking around that is not indicative of utter lack of faith. It is plausible that Buchak's account could be generalized, and she has the ingenuity to do it if she chooses. The chapter is full of other great insights from the very formal -- a full generalization of decision theory for cost of inquiry -- to the very personal -- the nature of personal commitment, and I simply can't do it justice here.

As promised, I now turn to a more detailed discussion of the two pieces on evil. Richard Otte's chapter is beguilingly simple. He argues for a conclusion that is bold but not without precedent (see, for example, Dougherty and Walls 2012): that the existence of evil in the world actually confirms theism rather than disconfirms it. The piece has many virtues. The arguments are very clear. Otte takes two common theories of confirmation – Likelihoodism and a more traditional Bayesianism -- and simply plugs in what he takes to be the relevant propositions concerning good and evil, and it turns out that on either view evil does not disconfirm theism and sometimes confirms it. His approach to this surprising conclusion is very different from that of others, for it has nothing to do with moral arguments for the existence of God or (as in Dougherty and Walls 2012) the pattern of evil discovered in the world. Rather, the key to his argument is focus not on "bare theism" but rather on a more robust "religious" theism, such as the three Abrahamic religions. For each of these religions, their truth entails that there is significant evil in the world. In the case of Christianity, the whole point of Christ's work is a response to evil. And few things in confirmation theory could be easier to illustrate than that a logical consequence of a theory will not disconfirm it (unless that logical consequence is a contradiction or some odd case like that).

At this point, the reader can be forgiven for some confusion. What Otte says is obviously true, and its truth obviously has the consequences he says it does. But can it really be this easy to escape the problem of evil? Has it all just been an obvious mistake? That the answer to these questions is surely "No" is reason to suspect something has somewhere gone wrong. One thing goes wrong here from the standpoint of natural theology: adding specifically religious material to the hypothesis of theism significantly reduces its prior probability. Otte says "An advantage of Likelihoodism is that prior probabilities play no role in comparing evidential strength" (132). It may well be true that priors shouldn't play a role in an account of measuring evidential support whether on comparative or absolute terms. However, they play an absolutely crucial role in measuring evidential probability, or the posterior probability, given by Bayes's Theorem. And that is what we ultimately want to know. So it is short-sighted to mount a defense on one flank that leaves you wide open on the other. (Two out of three measures of degree of confirmation Otte considers require plugging in the prior probability as well.)

It is open to Otte to be a subjectivist about probability and allow people any priors they want, saying that religious believers comes to the table with very high priors on their religious beliefs. But this makes a mockery of normative formal epistemology and trivializes the response. True, under the right circumstances priors will "wash out," but it is unsurprising that assigning extremely high priors to one hypothesis over the other gives that hypothesis an advantage. Surely what we want when we do normative formal epistemology is an assessment from some neutral point of view, to start from some Ur point and reconstruct a line of reasoning from there, such as Draper does with his aliens example (most recently in Draper and Dougherty 2013). And this brings us to the greatest shortcoming of Otte's chapter: not a mention of Draper.

Otte initially characterizes the evidence thusly, "we do not know of any good reason for God to permit certain evils" (128). He then says he will treat Rowe's argument, taking as the main premise

(R) No good state of affairs that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient being in permitting certain specific horrible evils.

Later in the same section, the evidence gets an unannounced addition.

(NK) Evil exists and we do not know of a good reason for God to permit it.

Note the important differences between these characterizations of the evidence. First, the evidence goes from something about our knowledge about evil to that conjoined with the existence of evil. Plausibly, (R) is meant to be understood so as to tacitly include the conjunct that certain specific horrible evils occur. But, given Otte's strategy, there is a world of difference between the proposition that some evil exists and the proposition that horrendous evils E1 and E2 exist. For though religious theism might entail that evil exists and it might entail that we shouldn't expect to understand the reasons for either evil in general or specific evils (though see Dougherty 2011 for an argument to the contrary), it does not entail that specific horrendous evils exist. And it is far from clear that it makes probable that any horrendous evils exist. Furthermore, it completely ignores the most widely known Bayesian argument from evil, which Otte elsewhere (2000) calls "One of the most important and widely discussed" versions of the probabilistic problem of evil: Paul Draper's neo-Humean argument (originally Draper 1989, reprinted in Howard-Snyder 1996, laid out with considerable precision in Draper 2009, and most recently defended in Draper and Dougherty 2013). This is almost inexplicable. For, first, Rowe's argument is generally acknowledged to be a total failure as he presented it (though see Dougherty 2013 concerning the "common sense problem of evil" interpretation of Rowe). Rowe (1996) admits explicitly (267) that his earlier argument (the one that Otte cites) is a failure  Further, Otte himself is often acknowledged as having been the one to show most clearly that Rowe's revised (1996) argument, which moves from straight induction to a probability argument, has seemingly insurmountable problems (Otte 2002). I just don't understand why Otte would focus his obvious talents on beating a dead horse rather than a live Draper. The evidence from which Draper starts is, essentially,

(D) The distribution of pain and pleasure have no systematic connection to moral properties

I think this datum can be dealt with (See Draper and Dougherty 2013), but it is not at all clear that (D) is entailed by religious theism. It is very, very probable on naturalism but it is hard to see it as more likely than not on theism. Objection: But the Gospel of Matthew says that "he maketh his sun to rise on the evil and on the good, and sendeth rain on the just and on the unjust" (Matthew 5:45). It's in the Bible! Reply: It is in the Bible because it is an observed fact, not because it is a theoretical commitment of theism.

Here is an analogy. Creationists and subscribers to Stephen J. Gould's non-Darwinian punctuated equilibrium view of evolution point to gaps in the fossil record to pester Darwinists. Now, it has long been known that there are gaps in the fossil record, Darwin himself notes the fact, and though some gaps have been filled, important gaps remain. Thus, Darwinists will have in their belief corpus that there are gaps in the fossil record. Thus "robust Darwinism" is what should be tested, not "bare Darwinism". Robust Darwinism will be more like this:

(RD) Bare Darwinism & There are important gaps in the fossil record.

And obviously gaps in the fossil record couldn't possibly disconfirm (RD). But this is just silly. Of course gaps in the fossil record are a problem for the theory (some gaps can be chalked up to being anomalies, see Dougherty and Pruss 2013, but not all of them, or so we may suppose). Gaps in the fossil record provide some reason to favor non-gradualist theories of evolution; they are also entailed by Creationism and so clearly favor it. Darwinian gradualists reject the alternative hypotheses for various reasons (mostly they are unfashionable), but not because they rightly ignore the problem posed by gaps in the fossil record. That there are gaps in the fossil record is no part of the core content of Darwinism. Darwinists have taken that on board because they had to learn to live with it.

Likewise, not only is the fact that pain and pleasure seem to serve only biological roles not part of bare theism, it is not part of Christian theism as such. The Apostle Paul and subsequent Christians have to take it on board because it is an undeniable fact. (What I have said here is not entirely dissimilar to ideas that Draper endorses (1993, 316) then takes back (2004, 44)). Otte addresses Draper's argument in Otte 2000, and Otte 2004, but Draper replied in 2004, and this is a missed opportunity to further that dialog. I am left still wondering what Otte thinks in detail about Draper 2004's rebuttals. Instead, Draper is never mentioned and the clock is turned back to 1986.

In the other item on the problem of evil, Michael Tooley makes a valiant attempt to resurrect a neo-Carnapian syntactic confirmation theory and to express in it an argument to the conclusion that it is very, very improbable that there is a God. The essay presents by far the most intimidating-looking math, but it is not nearly as difficult as it looks. Tooley spends a considerable amount of time elucidating and defending the mechanism, referring readers to his previous discussion with Plantinga (Plantinga and Tooley, 2008) for the context from which he is writing. He feels the need to do this because his presentation of the argument there was quite baroque and because it is widely believed among confirmation theorists to be utterly hopeless. There is little question in my mind (based on this reading and on a recent conversation with Tooley) that he has made genuine progress in creating a system that has certain advantages over any of Carnap's systems (it is closer in important ways to Carnap's earlier work than his later work). This raises really interesting methodological issues.

Tooley opens his chapter admitting that though the problem of evil is ancient and intuitive, "how best to develop that basic idea, and to convert it into an explicitly formulated argument . . . has remained unclear" (144). After giving his argument its new "easier" explication, he concludes by noting that there may well be a preferable system of inductive logic. However, he says hopefully, "It seems to me very likely, however, that very similar results to those I have derived here can also be proved by essentially parallel arguments, in any plausible alternative system of inductive logic" (163). That is quite a bold conjecture. Tooley's argument depends on probabilities changing very, very quickly with the number of observed cases. It also depends more than he hints on substantive issues in ethics -- such as the ratio of possible right-making properties to possible wrong-making properties, on the deontological approach he takes, and on other methodological issues, such as arguing from particular cases (see Tooley SEP article for further details). It appears that Tooley is so enmeshed in the details of his admittedly ingenious and fascinating mechanism that it is hard for him to see outside its elastic bounds. This, I suspect, is a danger inherent in formal philosophy.

To return to Tooley's opening meditation, it is reasonable to wonder whether, in light of the great (and greatly noted) difficulty of providing a regimented argument from evil in anything like a plausible form, the problem of evil can be considered to have much epistemic force, even allowing for its great emotional force. And since the argument from evil is far and away the most plausible argument for atheism, this worry carries over into the worry whether there is much hope for rational atheism. Though this is a natural thing to wonder, I think that in the end the verdict should actually be that the very fact that so many philosophers have for so many years been attempting to formulate the argument, that even their inability to yet hit upon on one that is plausibly correct is a sign that there is something there to be correctly formulated. This is an odd case where failure is evidence of possible success. The same goes for positive theistic arguments. Arguments from design go back to at least Aristotle's lost dialogue "On Prayer" and the cosmological argument from Plato. Augustine has an ontological argument. The question, then, would be which arguments have the most confirming power. Formal philosophers are better equipped to address this question, I think, than previous practitioners. This is one of the many springs of optimism that flow from this book.


Dougherty, Trent. 2011. "Recent Work on the Problem of Evil." Analysis 71:3, 560-573.

Dougherty, Trent and Cleveland, Scott. 2013 (forthcoming). "The Problem of Evil." Oxford Bibliographies Online.

Dougherty, Trent and Draper, Paul. 2013 (forthcoming). "The Explanatory Argument from Evil," Blackwell Companion to the Problem of Evil.

Dougherty, Trent and Pruss, Alex. 2013 (forthcoming). "Evil and the Problem of Anomaly." Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion.

Dougherty, Trent and Walls, Jerry. 2012. "Arguments from Evil." In Charles Taliaferro, Victoria S. Harrison, and Stewart Goetz, eds. Routledge Companion to Theism. New York: Routledge, 369-382.

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Draper, Paul. 2004. "More Pain and Pleasure: A Reply to Otte." In Peter van Inwagen, ed. Christian Faith and the Problem of Evil. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans Publishing Co., 41-54.

Draper, Paul.  2009. "The Problem of Evil." In Thomas P. Flint and Michael Rea, eds. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 332-351.

Otte, Richard. 2000. "Evidential Arguments from Evil." International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 48:1, 1-10.

Otte, Richard.  2002. "Rowe's Probabilistic Argument from Evil." Faith and Philosophy 19:2, 147-171.

Otte, Richard. 2004. "Probability and Draper's Evidential Argument from Evil." In Peter van Inwagen, ed. Christian faith and the Problem of Evil. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans Publishing Co., 26-40.

Plantinga, Alvin and Tooley, Michael. 2008. Knowledge of God. Malden, MA: Blackwell Pub.

Rowe, William. 1979. "The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism." American Philosophical Quarterly 16:4, 335-341.

Rowe, William.  1996. "The Evidential Argument from Evil: A Second Look." In Daniel Howard-Snyder, ed. The Evidential Argument from Evil. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 262-285.

Tooley, Michael. 2013. "The Problem of Evil." The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta, ed.