Procreation and Parenthood: The Ethics of Bearing and Rearing Children

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David Archard and David Benatar (eds.), Procreation and Parenthood: The Ethics of Bearing and Rearing Children, Oxford University Press, 2010, 191pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199590704.

Reviewed by Katherine King, Johns Hopkins University


This volume brings together six state-of-the-art essays on the ethics of procreation and parenthood. The essays are evenly divided between the themes, with the first three contributions addressing the ethics of procreation, including the ethics of bringing people into existence, obligations of procreative beneficence, and the scope of rights to reproductive freedom, and the latter three essays addressing the ethics of parenthood, specifically, the grounds and limits of parental obligations. The collection does not aim to provide an introduction or comprehensive overview of themes but rather to offer new contributions on key questions in the field. Accordingly, the contributions are at times quite specialized. To make the collection accessible to a wider audience, David Archard and David Benatar begin the book with a helpful introduction that contextualizes the contributions within larger philosophical and political debates.

The first half of the book is devoted to essays on the ethics of procreation. Tim Bayne begins by offering a general framework to structure inquiry into genethical questions, that is ethical questions addressing the nature and basis of bringing people into existence. He considers three general approaches to these questions: the no-faults view, which argues that coming into existence is not the proper subject of moral evaluation; the dual-benchmark view, which argues that it is reasonable to have an evaluative attitude towards coming into existence, and that one ought to adopt different standards for coming into and ending existence; and parity views which, like the dual benchmark view, maintain that we can reasonably have evaluative attitudes towards genethical questions but that we ought to have the same standards for coming into and ending existence. He argues that these frameworks should be evaluated in light of (1) their intuitive plausibility, (2) their consistency with our judgments in related domains, and (3) their internal consistency, and proceeds to do so.

The bulk of the essay is spent dismissing the no-faults and dual-benchmark views according to these criteria. The no-faults view runs counter to our intuitions, and so fails on condition (1). Not only is it counterintuitive to claim that one cannot be harmed by being brought into existence, but the no-faults view also commits one to an epicurean view of death, which has counterintuitive implications of its own. While it may be possible to get out of these epicurean commitments, he expresses skepticism about current attempts to do so. In contrast, Bayne acknowledges that the dual-benchmark view has initial plausibility, but argues that this initial plausibility fades when we try to identify what those thresholds are. In particular, supporters of the dual-benchmark view quickly find themselves in the position of claiming that the majority of children in the world were wronged by being brought into existence. The essay concludes with a brief discussion of the parity view, which Bayne suggests is the most plausible of the three models. While Bayne points towards a neutrality intuition to ground the threshold for coming into and exiting existence, he does not develop an argument for the position. Rather, he highlights a number of differences in our judgments about coming into existence and ending existence that, if not heeded, could lead one astray.

Michael Parker continues the focus on genethical questions with an engaging essay about the substantive obligations potential parents have to the children they are considering creating. He defends a Millian principle according to which we owe children an "ordinary chance at a desirable existence," and rejects maximizing principles, which argue that we should choose the children with the best chance of the best life. He argues that if we heed Mill's suggestion to take seriously the experiments in living of those who came before us, we would see that the characteristics that contribute to a good life are complex and often elusive. As a result, we cannot identify a priori the biological characteristics of an embryo that are most conducive to a good life and thereby choose the child with the best chance of the best life. Consequently, maximizing principles are undermining, paradoxical and potentially self-defeating. These claims are motivated through two interesting case studies of potential parents presented with the question of whether or not to use reproductive technologies to select children without particular diseases and disabilities. While the moral weight of these existing and emerging technologies remain at the forefront of Parker's analysis, his answer is refreshingly grounded and balanced, urging us that despite the growth of technologies that give parents increasing control over the biological constitution of their children, the conditions conducive to the possibility of a good life remain grounded in broader social, political, economic and environmental contexts.

In the final essay of the section, Benatar shifts the focus from the children being brought into existence to the rights of those adults who are reproducing. In particular, he argues that the right to reproductive freedom has been accorded too much weight and that this expansive approach fails to recognize that any right to reproductive freedom must be constrained by its consequences for those individuals being created. He argues that the reticence to constraining or even criticizing reproductive freedom results from unjustifiably attaching discrepant weights to the interests of present and future people. To correct this situation, we should strive for consistency in our judgments in procreative and non-procreative contexts such that "if it is wrong to inflict a particular hardship on an existent person then, barring any special considerations, it is wrong to inflict the same hardship on a future person" (79).

Benatar advances this position by refuting two arguments used to justify an asymmetry between existent and future people. The first argument claims that people cannot be harmed by being brought into existence, and so the possible condition of future people cannot ground restrictions of reproductive freedom. He considers two responses to this critique. First, he suggests that it could be countered by justifying the claim that people can be harmed by being brought into existence. This approach would require a solution to the non-identity problem, which Benatar suggests can be found; he offers some suggestions along these lines. However, even if one thinks that the non-identity problem is insolvable, he argues that this first critique could be met if bringing a child into existence was taken to be an exception to the liberal claim that only harms can justify restrictions on liberty. The second argument against his position maintains that while future people may have interests, those interests cannot override the interests of existent people. After considering four arguments to justify this special status for the interests of existent people, he dismisses this approach. He concludes that the interests of future people must be taken into account when determining the scope of the right to reproductive freedom and offers some criteria that should be used when delineating its scope.

The essays in the latter half of the book take up the second theme of the book and focus primarily on the nature and scope of the obligations associated with the special relationship between parents and children.

Archard opens this section with a consideration of the grounds for parental duties. He begins by arguing for an important distinction between parental obligation, which he understands as the obligation to ensure that a child is cared for and that someone acts as a parent to the child, and parental responsibilities, which are the responsibilities associated with the daily parenting of the child. While these two obligations are often taken to go hand-in-hand in what Archard refers to as the "parental package view," he argues that they can come apart. It is consistent to maintain that those who have caused a child to exist have parental obligations to that child, but nevertheless hold that those individuals are not obliged to rear the child themselves. Rather, they can discharge their parental responsibilities by making provision for others to care for the child. In short, child abandonment is, under certain circumstances, permissible. While he offers considerations in favor of a causal theory of parental obligation, he stops short of offering a positive argument for it, noting that the approach faces a number of unresolved problems.

Elizabeth Brake's essay enters into conversation with Archard's by arguing against the causal theory of parental obligations and in favor of a voluntarist account. Her argument for the voluntarist account relies on an understanding of how it is that we acquire special obligations, such as parental obligations. She postulates that there are two ways in which we can acquire them: we can either voluntarily assume them, or we can incur them as compensation for some harm we have caused. It is a distortion of the parental relationship to see it as compensatory for harm, and so she concludes that the only possibility is that these obligations are acquired voluntarily. While Brake does not engage directly with Archard's distinction between parental obligations and responsibilities, it is illuminating to read her essay in light of it as Archard's distinction offers possible refinements to her account.

In the final essay on the ethics of parenting, Colin Macleod considers the scope of parental duties and explores how considerations of justice could limit them. He starts his account with the idea that parents' responsibilities are strongly valorized: "parents think that their own families do and should 'come first'" with only modest constraints on how they can advance their children's interests (129). This strong valorization of parental responsibilities sits in tension with considerations of distributive justice as it could justify parents exercising their responsibilities in ways that impede or frustrate the achievement of justice. Macleod argues that this apparent conflict can be resolved. The tension between parental responsibilities and distributive justice is not the result of any deep conflict between the values, but rather a result of the unfairness of the existing regime. If there were a fair distribution of resources, parents could exercise discretion over how those goods were spent, including lavishing them on their children. The true challenge in harmonizing parental responsibilities with distributive justice is not resolving a deep conflict between these values, but rather determining the reasonable parameters for parental prerogatives when we lack confidence that the existing regime is just.

Each chapter in this collection makes a welcome contribution to the growing literature in the field. While the chapters address some highly specialized topics, the clarity of writing throughout, combined with the extensive background offered in the introduction, should make the volume accessible to anyone interested in the ethics of procreation and parenthood and the challenges presented by assisted reproductive technologies.