Profit, Prudence and Virtue: Essays in Ethics, Business and Management

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Samuel Gregg and James Stoner (eds.), Profit, Prudence and Virtue: Essays in Ethics, Business and Management, Academic Imprint, 2009, 265 pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845401597.

Reviewed by John R. Boatright, Loyola University Chicago



This volume, part of the St. Andrews Studies in Philosophy and Public Affairs, contains fifteen essays by a broad range of (mostly) academics on the state of business education and contemporary management thought. Except for four essays dealing with the current financial crisis, the contents of this volume were published previously in the book Rethinking Business Management: Examining the Foundations of Business Education, which was the product of a project undertaken jointly by the Social Trends Institute of New York City and the Witherspoon Institute in Princeton, New Jersey. The motivation for the project and the resulting books was the belief that business management is facing an ethical crisis with profound consequences for business education. Business schools, which are largely an American invention but are increasingly prevalent in Europe, not only bear some responsibility for the inculcation of a management outlook that may have contributed to recent scandals and the current financial crisis, but also have a responsibility to respond to the ethical crisis in business management in their role of educating future managers. The message of Profit, Prudence and Virtue is that business education must change.

This book may look toward the future, but the resources for its proposed response to the alleged ethical crisis lies far in the past. According to the contributors, we need to update the eternal verities of traditional ethics, especially the teachings of Aristotle and the natural law theorists. Although business has changed much, especially in the past few decades, some truths about the ethical life remain constant, though they may have become lost. The president of the Social Trends Institute writes in the foreword to Rethinking Business Management, “It is therefore pertinent to ask whether modern business education has successfully tied together the discoveries of the present with the wisdom of the past, the ephemeral with the permanent.”

After a useful introduction by the editors, the essays are divided into four sections on Foundations, Practical Challenges for Ethical Management, Teaching Ethics in Business School, and After the Credit Collapse. The four essays on the foundations of business and the business system touch on similar themes: that business activity contributes powerfully to the moral development of humans as individuals and social beings, and that the resulting moral development — which includes the cultivation of virtues and the conceptions of well-being, justice, and the common good — are critical for the success of business. Drawing heavily on Aristotle and natural law theory, these authors (Harold James, Roger Scruton, David Novak, and Robert P. George) do not question the technocratic and bureaucratic nature of modern business nor the profit motive, but they stress that businesses are still composed of people whose decisions matter, and that business is conducted within and has profound impacts on a community of individuals and a political and legal order. In a world in which the business system takes on an impersonal character, they affirm that individuals still matter as decision makers and that ultimately success should be defined in terms of the extent to which business contributes to human flourishing.

The three essays in the second section on practical challenges, written by a physician, (Anthony Daniels) a historian (Wilfred M. McClay), and a management consultant collaborating with a philosopher (Thomas R. Krause and Sean Kelsey), explore some of the subtle dynamics of managing institutions, both public and private. The essay by Daniels, the physician, notes that incentives, which are the chief instrument for motivating desirable conduct in economic systems, often have perverse consequences and that some use must be made of a sense of professionalism and other non-incentive-based sources of motivation. Krause and Kelsey, the management consultant and philosopher, emphasize the necessity of leadership that can articulate a vision for an institution that is noble but still true to its core mission. For a business this means accepting the economic nature of its activity but finding a broader vision in a humanistic understanding of business as a cooperative venture that should benefit everyone.

The third section on business schools contributes to an ongoing dialogue about the state of business education and the need for reform. There is no lack of critical ideas in this dialogue but little agreement on either the problems or the solutions. There are as many conceptions of the ideal business school as there are business school professors. This volume explores two different, though not wholly incompatible, sources of inspiration: stakeholder theory and — yes, again — Aristotle. R. Edward Freeman, a noted developer of stakeholder theory, and his colleague, David Newkirk, usefully outline the history of business schools and survey the recent critics, such as Sumantra Ghoshal and Henry Minzberg, who argue that business education has been led astray by its focus on (bad) theories and its attempt to be “scientific.” Two of the essays argue that business leaders must have a broadly humanistic education and be able to address business problems within a broader set of concerns in which business is a human enterprise. The other two essays are by writers — Edwin Hartman and James O’Toole — who have written extensively on what business and business education would be in an Aristotelian framework. Their essays, while valuable, do not go beyond their previous writings.

The final four essays, written for this volume, appear under the heading “After the Credit Collapse.” Readers looking for a close analysis of the technical causes of the current financial crisis will be disappointed. The writers of these essays take the view that the particular faults that may have led to this crisis are of less interest than the more general moral failings that lie behind most economic troubles. This leads Christopher Megone, the author of the section’s first essay, to explore the ways in which the effort to maximize shareholder value threatens integrity and virtue. The essay by Samuel Gregg, one of the editors of this volume, focuses more specifically on how, after the crisis, business schools could better prepare their students for the ethical challenges of the contemporary business world. His recommendations would not add significantly to the range of topics considered in business education but would entail placing them in a broader, more humanistic context, so that students would understand both the ethical and economic assumptions involved in the concept of credit, for example. Of the four essays in this section, only the one by Philip Booth attempts to analyze the underlying causes of the current financial crisis, and his recommendations call, interestingly, for more rigorous education in economics, although he argues that the subject should be expanded to include economic thought that seeks to understand market failures and sources of disequilibrium, such as the Austrian school and public choice theory.

This volume addresses two important present-day concerns. The current financial crisis has exposed serious deficiencies in our banking system and perhaps in capitalism as an economic system. And business education faces a crisis of confidence that is reflected in widespread dissatisfaction with the current curriculum and the kind of research being conducted. However, finding the ethical failings in either context is a difficult and controversial enterprise, and proposing remedies for either one is even more challenging. The essays collected here represent a sincere and high-minded attempt to bring the broadest possible perspective to the task by questioning the most basic assumptions and underlying values of our economic system. The result, unfortunately, is an unconvincing set of generalities that invite little disagreement but also provide little basis for concrete change. Aristotelian and natural law ethics, as well as stakeholder theory, have an intuitive appeal but a limited usefulness in ethical analysis of business life, and an economic system or a business education built on these foundations has yet to be fully articulated. Few readers are going to find much fault with the impulses of these writers — they appeal, after all, to “the wisdom of the past” — but they also do not provide much effective guidance for dealing with the complexities of the contemporary business world or the challenges of business education.