Profound Ignorance: Plato's Charmides and the Saving of Wisdom

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David Lawrence Levine, Profound Ignorance: Plato's Charmides and the Saving of Wisdom, Lexington Books, 2016, 357pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498501767.

Reviewed by Thomas M. Tuozzo, University of Kansas


David Lawrence Levine offers us a sustained reading of Plato's relatively neglected dialogue Charmides. On one level that dialogue can be seen as a philosophical investigation into what has been called the quintessentially Greek quality of sophrosyne, often translated "moderation" or "temperance." Such translations as these, however, cover only part of the wide semantic field of the Greek word, and Levine reasonably decided to leave the word untranslated. The aspect of this virtue (never in fact called a virtue in the dialogue, as Levine notes) that is highlighted and subjected to the most intense scrutiny in the dialogue is not the control of physical appetites, but rather the condition enjoined by the Delphic inscription: "Know thyself." Levine focuses on the questions of self and self-knowledge that inform the dialogue from beginning to end: what it consists in, who possesses it and who does not. The "profound ignorance" of Levine's title is precisely the condition of lacking such self-knowledge.

While the dialogue, then, is on one level an investigation into sophrosyne, that investigation is embedded in a conversation which has a very specific dramatic and historical setting, taking place among extremely significant historical figures. Levine insists that these factors are crucial for orienting our understanding of the philosophical investigation, and for the meaning of the dialogue as a whole. In particular, following the approach of Jacob Klein, he argues that the behavior that the characters exhibit in the dialogue -- including Socrates -- at times enacts or displays their possession (or lack) of sophrosyne, as that virtue is understood at various stages of the dialogue. A further important dimension of Levine's interpretation is that the two most important conceptions of sophrosyne that he identifies as at issue in the investigation correspond, he argues, to what Hegel diagnosed as distinctively ancient and modern understandings of subjectivity. (In parts of the book Levine draws heavily on Hegel and those who sympathetically develop and modify his views on subjectivity and the ancient world, such as Klein and Stanley Rosen; Hiram Caton's The Origin of Subjectivity is also often cited with approval). Levine clearly thinks there is something deeply right about Hegel's analysis of these two conceptions of subjectivity (conceived as possibilities available in both antiquity and modernity), and that one of them is ultimately pernicious, the other healthy. The Charmides, in Levine's view, is a contest between two possibilities that are also possibilities for us, and so has important lessons for the contemporary reader.

The dialogue starts with Socrates, just back in Athens from the first battle with major Athenian losses of the Peloponnesian War, returning to one of his haunts -- a wrestling school -- and asking how matters stand at home, with respect to philosophy and, in particular, with respect to youth who are promising for their beauty or wisdom. Levine interestingly argues that the rest of the dialogue constitutes Socrates' pursuit of an answer to this initial question. That pursuit takes the form of examining first the youth who is held out to him as the most promising of the rising generation, Charmides, and then the person presumably responsible for making that youth the man he is, his guardian, Critias. Thus the discussion is not so much an abstract philosophical investigation of sophrosyne as, from first to last, a "philosophical psychoanalysis" (37 et passim) of these two figures. As Levine argues, such a view of the dialogue is supported by the fact that, when Critias presents Socrates to Charmides as someone who will be able to cure his morning heavy-headedness, Socrates develops that conceit by pretending to have learned a Thracian form of medicine which is superior to and more effective than Greek medicine. This medicine owes its greater efficacy to its recognition that the soul must be sound (i.e., possess sophrosyne) if the treatment of the body is to be of any benefit, with the result that a preliminary assessment (and possible treatment) of the soul are called for before treating the body. Levine himself keeps up the conceit throughout his book, referring to the diagnostic questions, interventions, etc., of "Doctor Socrates."

The figures on which Socrates practices his philosophical psychoanalysis are important ones in the history of Athens. As Levine emphasizes, they were both deeply involved in the pro-Spartan oligarchy that held power in Athens for several months after Athens lost the Peloponnesian War, and whose repressive actions led to its being styled the regime of the "Thirty Tyrants" by the soon-restored democracy. While the dialogue is set some twenty years before these events, when the war is just beginning, it was certainly written quite a few years after them, and Levine is surely right that Plato expected his audience to be aware of those events as they read the dialogue. Levine, along with most commentators on the dialogue, accepts too uncritically (in my minority view) the unrelievedly negative portrait Xenophon paints of Critias, and maintains that this was the clear and evident truth that any reasonable person, and especially Plato, would have endorsed. (He notes evidence of a contrary ancient view without considering whether Plato might, in part, have shared it: 16 n. 15.) As they undergo the dialectical diagnosis of Doctor Socrates, Charmides and Critias are foredoomed to being revealed as very sick souls indeed.

The sickness that Levine has Socrates uncover differs somewhat from that found in Xenophon, however. Xenophon paints Critias as simply in thrall to greed and lust. For Levine, any immorality of this sort in Critias is rather a consequence of Critias' more basic illness, his false and grandiose view of the self, which Levine elucidates (with support from Hegel's analysis of sophistic thought) as "the principle of subjective freedom" (242). Such a conception of the self brings with it both an unwarranted self-assuredness and a failure to recognize the self's relation to others. To persons with such a view, Levine writes, "their principle is reduced to sheer willfulness. 'All is self-seeking, all is self-interest'" (243, emphasis in original; the second sentence is Levine quoting Hegel).

Does the text of the Charmides support this Hegelian interpretation of Critias? Levine finds conclusive evidence in 163c-d. At this point in the dialogue Critias explains that when he defined sophrosyne as "doing one's own things," he did not mean to include the sorts of activities tradesmen engage in, whether they are making things for themselves or others; he meant such things as are done "with the noble," or "nobly and beneficially." Socrates then reformulates Critias' answer as follows: "As soon as you started speaking I understood your meaning, that you called what is one's own and what belongs to oneself good". Levine finds great significance in this reformulation: "Socrates' explicit characterization allows us to see that for Critias self-interest is the measure of the good and the bad . . . One lives for oneself" (165, emphasis in original). And in his footnotes Levine argues that this is an "abstract or contentless self-determination [that] amounts to [Hegel's] 'self-will of private particularity' . . . or the self-assertion of unprincipled will (i.e., self-determination run amuck)" (194 n. 24, emphasis in original). Levine seems to move from "self-interest" to "contentless self-determination" by assuming that in (Socrates' formulation of) Critias' view there is no difference between self-interest and "our sense of our own benefit or self-interest" (179, my emphasis). I see little warrant for this in the text. Indeed, this move ignores Critias' mention of the noble, which mention at the very least raises the possibility that Critias has a very definite, aristocratic conception of what makes a life worth living, one that he takes to be objectively valid and not grounded in his sheer will, and one that may in fact involve the noble project of promoting the good of one's city (as seen from an aristocratic standpoint).

Levine's arguably tendentious interpretation of Critias' character leads him to give a somewhat simplified analysis of the important and complex discussion of self-knowledge in the latter half of the dialogue. Unlike many commentators (but like the author of this review), Levine insists that we distinguish sharply between the formulation which Critias advances as his interpretation of self-knowledge, "the knowledge of itself and other knowledges," and the reformulation Socrates gives it as "knowing what one knows and does not know." Levine's simplification consists in maintaining that the former is a vicious contentless will to mastery while the second is true Socratic knowledge of ignorance. His insistence that we have two competing versions of self-knowledge, a good and a bad one, obscures the fact that each of them is subjected to refinement as the dialogue continues. It also leads Levine to misunderstand and even misrepresent the text at several points. So Levine says that, at the culmination of his "dream" description of a city ruled by the knowledge of what one knows and does not know, Socrates claims that, in such a condition, "humankind . . . would do and live knowledgeably . . . and so we would do well and be happy (173c7-d4)" (282). But in fact in that passage Socrates says that, while it is clear that in such circumstances we would live knowledgeably, he is not able to infer from that that we would do well and live happily. This is not a mere slip; Levine goes on to make clear that in his view Socrates in fact believes that a city in which all the artisans knowledgeably ply their crafts is eo ipso a city where people live happily. But this is clearly not Socrates' view. Because Levine takes the city to have been framed on an authentically Socratic conception of self-knowledge, he misses the fact that the argument here is aimed at a familiar Socratic point: that things generally considered goods (in this case: the products of the crafts) are in fact not good (nor, ergo, is their efficient provision good) unless they are used well, or more specifically: unless their use is guided by a knowledge of the good. Burdened by this misunderstanding, Levine's analysis sheds little light on the very dense argumentation at the dialectical culmination of the dialogue. In general, the detailed analysis of the logical arguments in the dialogue is not Levine's strong suit.

Though there are difficulties with the argument of this book, it is a thoughtful treatment of the dialogue from a particular perspective, and worth reading on that account. The reader should be forewarned, however, that she will not find an up-to-date account of current scholarship on the Charmides here. Though published in 2016, the book seems to have a dramatic date, if I may so put it, of around 1995. So far as I can see the bibliography contains only one work of scholarship published in the present century (and that work is never cited in the body of the book). The main overall interpretations of the dialogue that Levine engages in his notes are those of T. Godfrey Tuckey, Berndt Witte, Ekkehard Martens, and Drew Hyland, the latest of which (Hyland) was published in 1981. It would have been interesting to see how Levine's argument might have been affected by an engagement with more recent literature.