Projection and Realism in Hume's Philosophy

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P. J. E. Kail, Projection and Realism in Hume's Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2007, 264pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199229505.

Reviewed by Angela Coventry, Portland State University


The aim of Projection and Realism in Hume's Philosophy is twofold: to "further our understanding of the general idea of projection" and to "cast new light on central areas of Hume's philosophy" (xxvi). Combining analytic and historical-contextual methods with an emphasis on close textual analysis on topics having to do with religion, external objects, causality, personal identity and morality, Peter Kail examines and reconciles "strands of thought in Hume that sound projective with those that sound realist" to seek "a balanced understanding of both the metaphor of projection and Hume's own position" (xxvi). The point of the approach is not to assume one particular understanding of projection or that Hume is some sort of realist or anti-realist, but rather to explore the projective- and realist-sounding parts of Hume's texts together in an effort "to understand why and in what sense they invite terms like 'projective', 'realist' or 'anti-realist'" (xxvi). Kail does provide, however, a schema for projection and deals with the realism/anti-realism distinction within the context of the particular area of concern.

The book divides into three parts. The first part covers projection, religion, and the external world. Projection may be feature or explanatory. Feature projection is the attribution of features of minds to other objects and has "spatial connotations" of throwing forward features of the mind, something 'in here', onto something 'out there' in the world (4). In explanatory projection, there is an "appearance whose explanation lies not in the world being the way that it seems but because of the mentality of the thinker", so the world seems a certain way to the thinker not because the world actually is that way but because of some feature or aspect in the mind of the thinker (4). A projective explanation contrasts with a responsive or detective explanation. In a responsive explanation, things such as beliefs, experiences or concepts are taken to be "properly responsive to the features that those beliefs, experiences and concepts purport to represent" (4). However, in a projective explanation, the "thinker is not responsive to the world in a way whereby her beliefs, concepts and experiences reflect their objects" and some aspect of the subject's mental life "explains why the thinker takes the world to be the way she takes it" (xxx, 3). The relevant detective contrast as well as the aspect of mentality that explains the appearance varies depending on the subject matter at hand.

Religious beliefs are feature and explanatory projective. Feature projection is the "manifestation of a disposition to anthropomorphize" by the "groundless attribution of human mentality to non-human objects" and explanatory projection is the non-detective explanation of the emergence of the belief in an invisible intelligent power (9, 12). Religious beliefs arise through the manifestation of an "independently identifiable psychological disposition that removes an anxiety generated by psychological discomfort" in the mind of the thinker and not because of a "grasp of evidence or for epistemic reasons" (14, 20). The origins of external world belief are explained similarly. The belief in the continued and distinct existence of external objects does not owe itself to the evidence of the senses or reason but rather "emerges through the manifestation of a standing psychological disposition that removes a psychological discomfort" or dissonance in the subject's mind (14).

External world and religious beliefs contrast on realist matters. Realism about external objects and God involves two claims: first "that we can form genuine thoughts about external objects or God in such a way that beliefs concerning the existence of them are capable of being true or false" and second "that there is some justification available for those beliefs" (xxxi). Realism about the external world is "vindicated", "defensible", "endorsed" and "justified" for Hume but realism about God is not (xxxi, 57). Belief in an external world is a universal and irresistible natural belief "liable to a form of practical justification" (72). The supposition of the continued and distinct existence of external objects is not supported by reason but nonetheless is "coherent" and gains authority from the "practical consequences of the propensity to believe in our senses and experience" (69). Religious belief is unsupported by reason and without practical authority.

The second part of the book concerns causal necessity and the self. Belief in causal necessity is both feature and explanatory projective. A detection of genuine causal necessity involves acquaintance "with some feature that would yield a priori knowledge of the object's causal consequences and render it impossible to conceive the cause without effect" (103). Genuine necessity cannot be detected and this motivates a projective explanation of "how we arrive at the very notion of necessary connection when we cannot detect it" (78). The relevant mental state which explains the appearance is the determination of the mind "felt after the repeated experience of regularities" and the mechanism of projection at work has two parts: the "functional change in the imagination" and the "attribution of this feature in the imagination to 'external objects'" (104). Hume's account of the belief in the existence of a substantial self is explanatory projective. A proper detection of the self involves acquaintance with a "substance of which perceptions are modes" but that sort of thing is not detected so the belief in the existence of a substantial self is explained as a projection of a "dissonance caused by conflicting psychological dispositions" (xxxiv).

Realist issues are prominent in both accounts of causal necessity and the self. Causal realism is the view that unknowable but real causal powers exist in nature. Kail argues that causal realism is compatible with Hume's projective account of causal power and that we should read Hume as a realist about causal power. Realism about the self is rejected: Hume did not assume the existence of an unknowable but substantial self. Realism figures into the account of the self in another way however: the assumption of causal realism explains the second thoughts on the self in the Appendix to the Treatise of Human Nature. The idea is that Hume's reasoning about the self "forces the conclusion" that perceptions cannot be necessarily connected but the self is a bundle of causally related perceptions (125). Now as a causal realist Hume would assume "that anything that is causally connected is connected by an unknowable necessary connection" so "his account of the self forces an unacceptable conclusion" (125). Since it is only on the assumption that Hume is a causal realist that his dissatisfaction about his account of personal identity makes sense, "reading the Appendix worries in light of the realist assumption" acts as a decisive reason in favor of a causal realist interpretation (126).

The third part of the book deals with moral evaluation. The overall aim of this final part is to reconcile the projective-sounding elements with Hume's "generally friendly attitude to virtue" (242). The account of moral value is both feature and explanatory projective. Explanatory projection is the part that explains how we come to have those thoughts or beliefs that some objects are essentially valuable or aversion-worthy for their own sake. Since objects are not intrinsically valuable or beautiful in and of themselves, we cannot explain our "thought and experience of them as such" by saying that "we detect essential value of objects"; instead, "our thought and experience of things as essentially valuable or beautiful is a projection of our sentiments" (xxxv). The relevant "states of mind of which such experiences and thoughts are projections are the peculiar pleasures and pains that are the moral and aesthetic sentiments" and the mechanism of feature projection makes these thoughts possible by the attribution of features of experience to objects of experience (145, 172). This is the relevance of Hume's comparison of value with secondary qualities: just "as our experience of objects as coloured is determined by the projection of sensation, so our experience and thought about objects as essentially valuable is determined by the projection of sentiments" (xxxv).

A mitigated realism is compatible with Hume's projective account of moral value. Mitigated realism combines two strands of realism. The first strand is metaphysical hedonism: that pleasure is valuable and pain is aversion-worthy. The second strand is the identification of moral value with natural properties of the useful and agreeable "to which moral sentiments are sensitive" (xxxiv). These natural properties are "moral facts" or "objective features" whose value is relational, that is, their value is understood in terms of their conduciveness to the well-being of society (241). Hume gives a projective explanation of how we come to think of relational values as essentially valuable on their own account, and of how the sentiments projected have a "functional nature" which both "renders salient to thinkers natural properties" and "elicits appropriate attitudes which in turn promote the wellbeing of society" (241). Once the relational values are identified and understood in terms of contribution to personal or societal well-being, "norms of correction" arise to fix variation in sentiment (240).

The aim of the work to bring together the projective elements of Hume's philosophy with those parts susceptible to contemporary labels like realism and anti-realism is commendable. In all three parts, Kail directs well the combination of drawing from the work of contemporary philosophers with an emphasis on the importance of situating the meaning of many doctrines in their historical context. Kail also demonstrates a thorough knowledge of scholarly literature on a wide range of interpretive controversies and takes great care to distinguish his own positions from other commentators. At times, the line of argumentation is dense and the close attention to scholarly detail easily distracts from the point at hand, but this effect is minimized by frequent summaries. Especially useful are the summaries at the beginning and end of each part as well as the detailed table of contents and survey of contents in the Introduction. This review evaluates two central theses: first, that Hume is an anti-realist about religious belief, and second, that Hume is a realist about necessary connections.

The extended comparison between external world and religious belief in the first part is illuminating, but Kail does not fully succeed in distinguishing between external world and religious beliefs on realist grounds. The central difference is that belief in the continued existence of external objects is a natural belief with authority whereas religious belief is not, but there is plentiful evidence from Hume's writings on religion, in particular "The Natural History of Religion" and the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, suggesting religious belief is an authoritative natural belief. Relevant here are the many insinuations that the belief in an intelligent designer is a natural belief. For instance, in the very opening of the "Natural History," Hume writes that, "The whole frame of nature bespeaks an intelligent author; and no rational enquirer can, after serious reflection, suspend his belief a moment with regard to the primary principles of genuine Theism and Religion." There is also the irregular design argument proposed by Cleanthes in the third part of the Dialogues. The irregular argument is deemed universal and irresistible, although not supported by reason. Some commentators claim that Philo cannot resist the design argument in the end as evidenced by the famous reversal of standpoint in the twelfth and final section of the Dialogues. For most of the preceding parts, Philo attacks the design argument with a barrage of criticisms, but in the beginning of the twelfth part it sounds as though he has suddenly changed his mind completely and does accept some version of the design argument after all. Philo even admits that he is sufficiently moved by the feeling of design that it awakens a profound adoration of the divine being, but of course he is also aware of the limitations concerning any reasoning about the nature of the divine being.

Some scholars interpret these apparent concessions to the design argument as sincere confessions of religious belief and indicate that religious belief falls into the class of those instinctive natural beliefs, which although ungrounded in reason are nonetheless justified, just like the belief in external objects, in which case realism about the author of nature appears a plausible option for Hume. On the anti-realist side, these concessions to the author of nature may be treated as insincere, ironic, or empty. Kail's exact position on the matter is not evident, although in a footnote he does say that "Philo's concession to religion is only apparent" in part twelve of the Dialogues and that he rejects the view "there is a further source for the belief in design, some further or more basic instinct," but he does not elaborate (64n.5, 71n.12). Certainly more could be done on how to approach those realist-sounding passages in order to properly establish Hume's anti-realism about religious belief. Hume's seeming concessions to the design argument demand careful attention to any anti-realist interpretation, just as realist interpretations need to deal with those passages very critical of religious belief. This is an especially suitable subject for development given the intent of the book to explore those parts of the texts inviting terms like realism and anti-realism together.

The case for causal realism in part two rests upon a proper diagnosis of Hume's doubts about the self in the Appendix. To this end, Kail closely examines realist interpretations that take Hume's many references to our ignorance of powers to show that he assumed the existence of these powers, as well as anti-realist readings that maintain that such references cannot be taken as evidence that Hume assumed the existence of powers, and rather interpret them as insincere, ironic, or amenable to deflationary readings. Kail reaches a "stalemate" between causal realist and anti-realist readings, and a form of agnosticism about the existence of causal powers "seemed to be on the cards" until we see that the assumption of necessary connections provides a "neat solution" to the "notoriously recalcitrant Appendix problem", tipping the balance "firmly" in favor of causal realism (124, 126). Now Kail's solution to Hume's worries in the Appendix is intriguing and even quite tempting, but I am not convinced that his reading of the Appendix entirely captures Hume's second thoughts about the self on two counts.

First, there is no denying Hume's dissatisfaction with the account of the self. His views involve him in a "labyrinth" and he "neither [knows] how to correct [his] former opinions, nor how to render them consistent" (T. App.10).[1] The two principles he cannot render consistent are, first, that all our distinct perceptions are distinct existences, and second, that the mind never perceives any real connection among distinct existences. There would be no difficulty either if our perceptions did inhere in something "simple and individual", or if the mind perceived "some real connexion among them" (T. App.21). Pleading "the privilege of a sceptic," Hume confesses that this difficulty is "too hard for [his] understanding" and hopes the difficulty can be remedied in the future (Ibid). On Kail's reading, Hume realized that his account of the self forces an unacceptable inconsistency, indeed, a veritable labyrinth from which he cannot escape since neither principle can be renounced (136). However, the supposition that Hume himself recognized that his account of the self is doomed is difficult to square with more positive remarks made in the Appendix. He hopes that the difficulty will be solved in his refusal to "pronounce" the difficulty "absolutely insuperable" and seems pleased with his account of personal identity (T. App.21). Hume remarks that his "extraordinary" conclusion that we only feel a connection between the distinct perceptions "need not surprize us" (T. App.20). The doctrine illuminates what most philosophers are inclined to think, that personal identity arises out of consciousness, and that consciousness "is nothing but a reflected thought or perception", and his theory has so far a "promising aspect" (Ibid). Now if Hume detected a fatal problem, then it is unexpected that there is any hope or satisfaction with the account of the self at all.

The next concern is the integral role of causal anti-realism in both the explanation of the theory and the two principles in the Appendix. The causal anti-realist assumption at work is that genuine necessity belongs only to the mind and not to the object. Kail admits Hume suggests on occasion that necessity is nothing but the internal determination of the mind (124). For example, when Hume states that the "connexion, tie, or energy lies merely in ourselves, and is nothing but that determination of the mind, which is acquir'd by custom, and causes us to make a transition from an object to its usual attendant" (T. He even says that this "customary transition is the same with power and necessity, which are consequently qualities of perceptions, not of objects" (T. This sort of causal anti-realism assumption is needed for Hume's conclusion about personal identity. He claims that "we only feel a connexion or a determination of the thought, to pass from one object to another" so it follows "thought alone finds personal identity, when reflecting on the train of past perceptions, that compose a mind, the ideas of them are felt to be connected together and naturally introduce each other" (T. App.20). Causal anti-realism is also relevant given the two principles he cannot renounce. Some scholars point out the two principles are consistent and that the acceptance of the first principle provides an explanation for the second principle. The two claims taken together constitute the fundamental grounds for thinking that personal identity arises solely from associative principles of the imagination rather than from real connections among distinct existences. There is no reason why an account of Hume's worries in line with causal anti-realism cannot be given. No such account is attempted here; the present point is merely that until the relation of causal anti-realism to the Appendix is figured out, concluding the case in favor of causal realism based on a causal realist reading of the Appendix seems premature.

Projection and Realism in Hume's Philosophy is a rich and valuable addition to Hume scholarship. The most welcome contribution of the work is the comprehensive picture of the sort of projection at work in Hume's philosophy informed by the systematic tracking of the various usages throughout his work. The line of research into the connection between projection, realism, and anti-realism is fruitful. The detailed and clever textual analysis coupled with the originality and boldness of many of the core theses ensures that Kail's book will remain both an indispensable reference and a source of inspiration for the future scholarly activities of Hume specialists.

[1] A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by D. F. Norton and M. J. Norton, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000. References cite the book, chapter, section, and paragraph.