Prolegomena to a Philosophy of Religion

Placeholder book cover

J. L. Schellenberg, Prolegomena to a Philosophy of Religion, Cornell University Press, 2005, 226 pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 080144358X.

Reviewed by Gary Rosenkrantz, University of North Carolina at Greensboro


This valuable treatise is a comprehensive examination of foundational matters in the philosophy of religion. Schellenberg makes a serious effort to define the basic ideas in this area (sensibly enough, the first challenge he takes up is that of defining religion). As part of this effort, he proposes definitions of four basic responses to religious claims: religious belief, disbelief, skepticism, and faith. Another aspect of Schellenberg's examination of foundational matters in philosophy of religion is his effort to formulate general principles of justification for these four basic responses to religious claims. In this context, he distinguishes the justification of responses, propositions, and persons, as well as the justification of response-types and response-tokens.

On the whole, the book is well argued; a number of the arguments are ingenious. One of the main arguments is highly original. The conclusion of this argument is that religious faith does not require religious belief, and that in its most basic form, religious faith is incompatible with religious belief. This conclusion conflicts with the commonly held idea that faith requires belief. It also conflicts with the traditional doctrine that to have faith is to have a belief which is held in the absence of adequate epistemic justification for that belief. Since many readers will find the notion that faith does not entail belief counter-intuitive, it is likely that Prolegomena to a Philosophy of Religion will generate considerable controversy and discussion. Although it clearly falls within the mainstream of the analytical tradition, Schellenberg's book is free of logical formalities and technicalities. The book is effectively organized, but given the considerable density of the argumentation, it is not an easy read.

In chapter 1, Schellenberg investigates the basic idea of religion (or of the religious). He argues that religion in the personal sense is more basic than religion in the institutional sense, and so focuses on the concept of the former. Schellenberg criticizes the claim that religion is a family resemblance concept, and hence rejects the notion that there is no single factor common to every case of religion. He also provides a strong defense of the thesis that there are four conditions (paraphrased below) which are jointly necessary and sufficient for personal religion: (1) frequent ideas of a transmundane reality, (2) emphasis on a significant good, for oneself and others, realizable via a relation to this reality, (3) cultivation of such a relation, and (4) a tendency to ultimize the elements of the foregoing three conditions, for instance, to think that our deepest good involves our relating ourselves in the appropriate way to the aforementioned reality. Based upon his definition of the religious, Schellenberg develops a closely related account of a person's being religious in the sense that is of special interest to the philosophy of religion.

In chapter 2, Schellenberg examines belief. He attempts to provide an enlightening definition of belief that p, and based on that definition, a definition of religious belief in. He dismisses the proposed definition that "to believe that p is to think of the state of affairs reported by p and to take that state of affairs to obtain." According to Schellenberg, this proposed definition is vague and, more seriously, circular. The definition of S believes that p favored by Schellenberg is that "S is disposed to apprehend the state of affairs reported by p, when that state of affairs comes to mind, under the concept reality." Unfortunately, it appears that if Schellenberg's criticisms of the first proposal to define belief that p are cogent, then similar criticisms also apply to his proposed definition of belief that p. Schellenberg's account of propositional belief seems to entail that belief de dicto is reducible to belief de re, though he does not point this out explicitly. Of course, to carry out such a reduction is not to offer an account of belief in general.

In chapter 3, Schellenberg explores religious belief and religious disbelief and proposes definitions of propositional religious belief, affective religious belief, propositional religious disbelief, and affective religious disbelief.

In chapter 4, Schellenberg distinguishes doubts and doubting, passive and active skepticism, and identifies a variety of forms of religious skepticism, including the following three basic forms: (1) common skepticism (doubt about some specific religious proposition or some limited group of religious propositions), (2) categorical skepticism (doubt that an ultimate and salvific reality exists), and (3) capacity skepticism (doubt that we have the capacity to discover at least some basic truths about an ultimate salvific reality).

In chapters 5 and 6, Schellenberg defends the novel and provocative thesis that propositional religious faith is incompatible with propositional religious belief. His argument is based upon the distinction between one's voluntary acts and states of oneself that are caused involuntarily. One's voluntary acts, in the relevant sense, appear to be those of one's acts which are not performed under coercion and which are such that one has the power to directly control whether one performs them by means of one's volitions. Schellenberg argues that while having faith that p is a voluntary act, believing that p is a state that is caused involuntarily. From these two premises, he concludes that having faith that p does not involve believing that p.

Based upon this conclusion, Schellenberg argues that there are two sorts of faith, neither of which entails belief: faith in (or operational faith), and faith that (or propositional faith). Below, I paraphrase, and then discuss, Schellenberg's proposed definitions of these two sorts of faith.

S has faith in x =df. (i) either S believes that p or has faith that p, where p is the proposition that x [an ultimate and salvific reality] will satisfy S's needs and desires, (ii) S does not have evidence making p certain, (iii) if S is disposed to act on this belief or faith, and if p is false, then bad consequences will ensue for S, & (iv) S is disposed to act on the belief or faith in question.

S has faith that p =df. (i) S does not possess evidence that is causally sufficient for S's believing p, (ii) S regards the state of affairs that p signifies as good, (iii) S stubbornly and relentlessly represents the world to himself as including that state of affairs, (iv) S voluntarily commits himself to adopting a policy of assenting to p, & (v) S identifies his attitude as a religious one.

Given this pair of definitions, although S has faith in x is compatible with S's believing that x exists, it is also compatible with S's having no opinion about x's existence (and thus is compatible with S's not believing that x exists). Furthermore, as defined, S has faith that p entails that S has no opinion about p's truth (and so is both incompatible with S's believing that p and incompatible with S's disbelieving that p).

With respect to conditions (iii) and (iv) of the definition of S has faith that p, Schellenberg argues that one can represent the world as including a certain state of affairs without believing that the state of affairs in question obtains, and that one can assent to a proposition without believing that proposition. Rather, to exercise these abilities is to perform certain voluntary mental acts. In Schellenberg's view, since faith that p requires performing such voluntary mental acts, his definition of faith that p satisfies what is [by his lights] a desideratum for any adequate definition of faith that p, namely, that one voluntarily acquires or loses faith that p.

However, I remain unconvinced that faith that p is incompatible with belief that p. Recall that Schellenberg's argument depends upon the crucial claim that faith that p can be acquired or lost voluntarily, in other words, that one can directly control whether one acquires or loses propositional faith by means of one's volitions; whereas propositional belief cannot be acquired or lost voluntarily in this sense. Schellenberg appeals to various pieces of intuitive data according to which it is up to the individual to determine whether he or she has faith that p. He then claims that this body of intuitive data is best understood as entailing that one can directly control whether one has faith that p by means of one's volitions. But I am not persuaded that the data in question is best understood in this way. It is not apparent that faith that p requires anything more than one's being able to voluntarily exert indirect control over whether one has faith that p. And this is compatible with the assumption that faith that p entails belief that p, and hence that faith that p cannot be directly controlled by means of one's volitions. For example, as Pascal famously argued, one can voluntarily self-induce faith that God exists by adopting a policy of conformity to religious customs and practices. Similarly, it seems that one can voluntarily self-induce faith that God exists by adopting a policy of assenting to the proposition that God exists (in Schellenberg's sense of assenting to a proposition), or a policy of representing the world to oneself as including the state of affairs that God exists (in Schellenberg's sense of representing the world to oneself as including a state of affairs). Thus, it appears that even if the traditional understanding of propositional religious faith as entailing propositional religious belief is correct, a variety of methods can be voluntarily employed by faith-seekers as an indirect means of acquiring faith that God exists. For these reasons, I find myself unpersuaded that faith that p is incompatible with belief that p. Still, even if Schellenberg's account of propositional faith turns out to be mistaken, it seems that, at least, it provides a significant addition to our understanding of the psychology of voluntarily self-induced propositional religious faith.

In chapter 7, Schellenberg attempts to answer the question "What are the most general aims of philosophy of religion?" The answer that is usually given is that these aims concern the meaning and justification of religious claims. After critically assessing this standard answer, Schellenberg presents his answer to the question. Schellenberg sums up that answer in the following [lengthy] statement on p. 191.

The aims of philosophy of religion should be to bring to bear methods and results from the rest of philosophy in (1) a comprehensive study of prolegomenous issues, including the questions of what religion, the various (actual and possible) religious propositions or claims, and the various responses to religious claims, as well as the proper evaluation of the latter and of those who embrace them, most fundamentally amount to; and in (2) an inquiry geared to determining whether any religious claims are justified, and also which responses to religious claims are justified, and to what extent persons who instantiate such responses -- in particular, religious responses -- are justified in doing so (these I have called the lower-level aims, whose realization is facilitated by work on prolegomena); and all of this not just for its own sake but in order to facilitate (3) an investigation of what bearing religious claims may have on theoretical problems in other areas of philosophy and (4) a rational evaluation of religious practice (these last are two higher-level aims).

In chapter 8, Schellenberg defends what he takes to be the most general principles for evaluating the justification of responses to religious claims. Here Schellenberg is concerned with the justification of response-types rather than response-tokens, for example, with the justification of belief-types rather than belief-tokens. He discusses the dispute between justificational monism, the view that epistemic principles pertaining to truth-conduciveness are the only relevant ones, and justificational pluralism, the view that practical evaluative principles pertaining to goods other than truth-conduciveness are also relevant. Schellenberg finds it difficult to decide between the two views. On p. 210, after what I would describe as a very detailed and powerful critique of justificational pluralism, he states that he is inclined to think that justificational monism is correct, while on p. 217, he suggests that in the final analysis justificational pluralism is correct. The appearance of inconsistency is unfortunate. In any event, Schellenberg's final position seems to be that while justificational pluralism is correct in principle, it is unlikely that goods other than truth-conduciveness will ever actually trump truth-conduciveness, at least within the context of evaluating the justification of response-types.