Ptolemy's Philosophy: Mathematics as a Way of Life

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Jacqueline Feke, Ptolemy's Philosophy: Mathematics as a Way of Life, Princeton University Press, 2018, 234pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691179582.

Reviewed by Daryn Lehoux, Queen's University


The opening paragraphs of Ptolemy's definitive work of ancient astronomy, the Almagest, are the sort of thing that finds a happy home in coursepacks for undergraduate History of Science lectures. They contain grand methodological pronouncements about mathematics, physics, and theology by one of the greatest scientific thinkers of his own (or indeed of any) age, a crisp statement of the ancient idea of the eternal and unchanging motions of the heavens, and a paean to how important the intellectual work of understanding those motions is.

But those opening sentences are also, it should be said, almost entirely unrepresentative of the contents of the Almagest itself, which is -- once the introduction is out of the way -- a memorably challenging technical work of very foreign mathematics and astronomy. Indeed, explicit philosophical passages of this sort are few and far between in Ptolemy's extensive oeuvre, and although the introduction to the Almagest is not especially representative of Ptolemy's writing generally, Jacqueline Feke makes a good case for how the argument of this passage underpins and justifies virtually everything Ptolemy does. She also makes a very good case for Ptolemy as an interesting -- and uniquely placed -- participant in Hellenistic debates on epistemology, ethics, and (especially, it seems to me) psychology.

A little over 25 years ago now, Ptolemy's philosophical (as opposed to his scientific) concerns began to see a marked increase in what has turned out to be much-deserved scholarly attention. The initial push came in the form of two books. The first was the 1989 publication and translation of Ptolemy's short (and at the time, still largely enigmatic) On the Criterion and Hegemonikon, which was bundled with a series of scholarly essays on its philosophical import by some of the leading lights in Hellenistic philosophy.[1] The second was Liba Taub's 1993 Ptolemy's Universe, which explored the ethical and epistemological aspects of Ptolemy's astronomical and cosmological writing.[2] Since then, we have seen increased attention paid to philosophical concerns in other parts of Ptolemy's extensive corpus, particularly his often difficult book on music theory and psychology, the Harmonics, as well as his Optics and his astrology.[3] This combined attention to (especially) the Harmonics and On the Criterion, and in particular to their explicit meditations on the epistemology of experience and on psychology, have provided an essential backdrop for Feke's important and timely book.

The book consists of seven chapters. The first two are a close examination of the epistemic hierarchy of mathematics, physics and theology in the introduction to the Almagest, as compared to Aristotle and Plato, and the classifications of physical versus mathematical objects. It has long been recognized that Ptolemy's philosophy was, as was so typical of the second century CE, some kind of amalgamation of Aristotelian, Platonic, and Stoic ideas, of the sort that generally goes under the name of ancient 'eclecticism.' Various strains of the major schools can certainly be found in Ptolemy, but Feke's book goes some considerable distance to tease out the details and show the ways in which Ptolemy is philosophically innovative, or indeed, as Feke puts it, "unprecedented" and "subversive." Of particular interest, Feke shows that Ptolemy develops much of the detail in this epistemic picture in his critical reading of something like what we find in the roughly contemporary Middle Platonist Alcinous, together with an attempt to integrate that critique with a truth-pursuant (Aristotelian) empiricism. Certainly Ptolemy's criticism of the epistemological foundations of theology in favour of mathematics in Almagest 1.1 strikes any reader as an interesting response to Aristotle, at the very least, but the full implications of Ptolemy's position turn out to bear considerable philosophical fruit as we look at that position in light of his corpus as a larger whole. While physics as a discipline is taken by Ptolemy to be conjectural, at the same time he works out important criteria (or indeed the Criterion) according to which sensory experience is to be understood and processed by a properly attuned reason to produce mathematical knowledge about physical things.

This centrality of mathematics defines the heart of the Ptolemaic project. Ptolemy was of course a very accomplished mathematician, and he published historically important work in nearly every field of the applied mathematics that existed in his day. It is here, in Ptolemy's use of mathematics as the bridge between conjecture and certainty in the epistemology of experience, that we find what Feke sees as the central ethical concern in Ptolemy. Mathematics is, for Ptolemy, the key to the good life: its study and imitation brings the soul into a relationship with the divine.

The remaining chapters explore the precise nature of this relationship in Ptolemy's work on harmony (musical, celestial, and psychological) and astrology. A full half of a millennium before Ptolemy, Plato had claimed in the Timaeus that harmony and astronomy were the two keys to ordering the human soul. This has always struck me as more than a little optimistic, given the larval state of astronomy in Plato's Athens (the planets didn't even have Greek names yet, the author of the Epinomis tells us, and Plato's older contemporary Democritus didn't know how many there were). Nevertheless the Platonic promise would historically bear itself out: Greeks and Romans of Ptolemy's day had very good mathematical models for planetary motion, models that would allow them to call those motions 'regular' with good justification, and that would allow them to bring together, at least in principle, planetary astronomy and a thoroughly mathematized harmonics, and to draw a line from there to the workings of the human soul. What Feke does in her remaining chapters, then, is to show how Ptolemy did considerable work towards understanding what it is about the human soul specifically -- how it is structured and how it relates to the body -- that causes it to be moved by the orderly motions we find in music and astronomy. Here Feke's psychological concerns, and I think much of what is most innovative in the book, come more fully into focus.

Through a close reading of Ptolemy's various analyses of the soul, Feke is able to show how Ptolemy departs from Stoic, Platonic, and Aristotelian accounts of the soul in his attempts to mathematize its parts, to establish what the connections were between the structures of the soul and the structures of musical harmonies -- after all, we can improve the soul just by playing beautiful music at it. As a bonus, Feke also shows, I think plausibly, that On the Criterion predates the rest of Ptolemy's works, and the Harmonics in particular. This point will perhaps be no surprise to many readers of On the Criterion (it reads so differently from his other works that there was until recently still some reticence about its authenticity), but I'm not sure I've seen a more detailed and compelling argument for its dating.[4]

Feke ends with an account of astrological causation in Ptolemy, and the important ways in which Ptolemy's astrology is epistemically more conjectural than his astronomy and harmonics. And here -- as with mathematics, physics, and theology in the opening sections of the Almagest -- we find a parallel epistemic hierarchy. With harmonics, we can perform experiments with instruments to determine the mathematical ratios behind the harmonies that please and educate the soul in listening. Here there is a very tight feedback loop between the physical structure of the soul that is being pleased, the relationships between the sounds it is hearing, and the mathematics that describes both. There is empirical content, to be sure, as an integral part of the knowledge that is produced in the person who studies harmonics, but it is rather tightly constrained: all the phenomena can be reproduced by anyone, anywhere, on a simple monochord. By contrast, the motions of the planets are, as Ptolemy recognized, inherently and significantly more complex and difficult than musical tones are. There are no easy laboratory experiments that can create astronomical phenomena out of thin air. Instead, the seeker for knowledge must go out into the night air and try and observe positions, ever so carefully, and then compare those positions to whatever positions one can find reported in the imperfectly preserved, sometimes imperfectly observed, astronomical record.

Approximations and errors are inevitable. Nevertheless the quest for mathematization is still fruitful even here. Moving to the still messier epistemic situation of astrology, where we try to establish the interactions between these planetary positions and human natures down here on earth, we strike even further into conjecture, Ptolemy says. Not only are the questions inherently messier (people's moods and decisions and destinies follow nothing so simple as a mathematizable orbit), but the physics is also difficult to understand and the database of historical examples harder to constrain. Nevertheless, for Ptolemy, astrology is also worth studying. Certainly some of its theoretical structures and relationships are conformable to some of the simplest (and therefore most essential) harmonic ratios, so we can see some basis for confidence therein.

What Feke shows is just how carefully Ptolemy navigates the epistemic thorns as he progresses from the certainty provided by mathematics and harmonics to the (important, qualifiedly trustworthy) conjectures of astrology to paint a cosmological picture that in many ways fulfills or fleshes out the promise Plato had made many years before. Perhaps, in the end, this wonderful book will show that those opening sentences of the Almagest deserve a place in modern thinking about the history of philosophy, as well as in the history of the sciences.

[1] Neal, P. and G. Huby' eds. (1989) The Criterion of Truth: Essays Written in Honour of George Kerferd together with a Text and Translation (with Annotations) of Ptolemy's On the Kriterion and Hegemonikon, Liverpool.

[2] Taub, L. (1993) Ptolemy's Universe: The Natural Philosophical and Ethical Foundations of Ptolemy's Astronomy, Chicago.

[3] See, for example, Barker, A. (2001) Scientific Method in Ptolemy's Harmonics, Cambridge; Creese, D. (2010) The Monochord in Ancient Greek Harmonic Science, Cambridge; Lehoux, D. (2012) What Did the Romans Know? An Inquiry into Science and Worldmaking, Chicago; and the essays in the forthcoming Bowen, A. C. and E. Gannagé, eds., Ptolemy's Philosophy and its Reception in Greek, Arabic, and Hebrew Thought, Leiden.

[4] I believe that Alexander Jones convinced most sceptics of the work's authorship when he showed that there are three idiosyncratic Greek words that, outside of On the Criterion, only otherwise appear in Ptolemy, not to mention On the Criterion's repeated use of a characteristic verbal tic of Ptolemy's involving perfect passive verbs. See Feke, J. and A. Jones (2010) 'Ptolemy,' in L. Gerson, ed., The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity vol. 1, Cambridge, p. 197-209.