Public Capitalism: The Political Authority of Corporate Executives

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Christopher McMahon, Public Capitalism: The Political Authority of Corporate Executives, University of Pennsylvania Press, 2013, 206pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780812244441.

Reviewed by Waheed Hussain, University of Pennsylvania


Along with a small cadre of executives and board members, Rex Tillerson, CEO of ExxonMobil, commands the efforts of over 80,000 employees worldwide. Marillyn Hewson, CEO of Lockheed Martin, commands 123,000 employees, and Howard Schultz, CEO of Starbucks, commands 149,000. These are just a few examples of the Pharaonic authority of corporate executives in our society. Most people experience this authority more viscerally in their lives than the authority of even the most powerful government officials, yet few philosophers have explored the question of whether the authority of corporate executives is morally justified. Few philosophers, that is, besides Christopher McMahon, whose work on the subject is among the very best.

In his intriguing new book, McMahon develops his views about executive authority into a novel conception of the role of corporations and corporate executives in a capitalist society. According to "public capitalism," corporations are not private organizations and corporate executives are not the agents of shareholders. Instead, corporations are government agencies and corporate executives are public officials. The book is original, densely argued, and provocative. Although the case for public capitalism does not come together in a clear and convincing way, McMahon's book makes an important contribution to our understanding of corporate capitalism.

Public Capitalism

Let me start with some basic elements of McMahon's outlook. On his view, there are many fundamental, impersonal social goods, including: distributive justice, the preservation of the environment, social prosperity (i.e., the satisfaction of the actual wants and needs of the population), the maintenance of the health of the population, the defense of the country, and the advancement of knowledge (p. 46). These goods must be promoted, but each of us has a certain moral prerogative to pursue our own personal projects, even if these are not optimal from the standpoint of advancing these goods. A conception of the "public good" consists of an account of the impersonal goods, their relative importance, and an account of the moral prerogative of individuals to pursue their private ends.

A political community consists of a group of individuals who cooperate with one another to advance the public good, and the government coordinates the collective effort. The legislature articulates an official conception of the public good and sets out the broad features of a shared social plan for advancing it. Subordinate government agencies then fill out the details of the plan. For example, if the legislature decides to build an interstate highway system to connect different parts of the country, the Department of Transportation will work out the details, deciding where to build the highways, who will have access to them, how fast people can drive, and so on.

The essence of public capitalism is the idea that large business corporations operate as subordinate agencies of the government. Just as the Department of Transportation fills in the details of the shared social plan that cover how the interstate highway system will be organized, business corporations fill in the details that cover how a variety of capital assets and labor resources will be deployed. Corporate executives are, in effect, public officials: they exercise a form of authority, on behalf of the community as a whole, that aims at the public good and is continuous with the encompassing planning authority of the legislature.

A central implication of public capitalism is that corporate executives must not make decisions based exclusively on profit considerations; they should pursue profit as one part of a broader effort to promote the public good. Profits clearly matter: when all the firms in a competitive market economy pursue profits, the market process generates social prosperity. But prosperity is just one good among many, and corporations form part of a system of social governance that aims to advance the full range of social goods. So instead of focusing exclusively on profits, corporate executives should approach "problems in a way that reflects their status as partners in a collaborative effort with government to promote the public good" (p. 135).

In practice, public capitalism requires, first, that corporate executives must never use financial inducements to bend government officials to their will: executives must always recognize that legislators and regulators are their superiors in social governance (pp. 98-9). Second, corporate executives should pursue profits, but they must do so in ways that accommodate the claims of other social goods besides prosperity (pp. 150-53). For example, the advancement of knowledge is an important social good; however, media executives may find that the single-minded pursuit of profit leads them to produce "less news and more mindless entertainment" (p. 147). Public capitalism says that media executives must think innovatively about how to modify their business practices so as to generate profits while also increasing the general level of education and awareness in the population. One solution would be to develop programs, such as The Daily Show, that make money and keep the public informed.

The Legitimacy Argument for Public Capitalism

Why should we accept public capitalism as the right account of the role of corporations and corporate executives in our society? Essentially, McMahon argues that the authority of corporate executives can only be justified if it functions as a component in the broader system of social coordination headed by the government (p. 111).

Let's take the argument in steps. McMahon assumes that authority must be "legitimate" in order to be justified. An agent A's authority in an organization is legitimate if and only if almost everyone in the organization would judge, if reasoning correctly, that she has sufficient reason to do what A tells her to do, where these reasons do not stem directly from sanctions or the threat of sanctions (p. 23). Basically, there must be a sound, coercion-independent justification, from each member's perspective, for doing what A says.

In chapter 2, McMahon considers and rejects the possibility that the legitimacy of executives' authority could stem from promises of obedience on the part of employees or from some other private obligation. The legitimacy of executive authority must have a foundation in "public" rather than "private" morality (pp.16-20).

According to the "public model" (chapter 3), the legitimacy of executive authority stems from the fact that executives facilitate cooperation for the public good. Suppose that employees in a corporation could contribute to the public good if they worked together: for example, employees at Lego can make toys that make children happy. Employees cannot produce the benefit unless someone coordinates their disparate efforts, so each employee may judge that he has sufficient reason to do what executives tell him to do, not because of any past promise of obedience, but simply because deference is necessary to produce the benefit.

Legitimacy on the public model depends, however, on employees having adequate reason to make ideological concessions. Employees in a large corporation will have different conceptions of the public good: for example, if the "princess" Lego set reinforces traditional gender roles for girls, employees at Lego may have different views about whether this is a good thing. Given the fact of political disagreement, cooperation will require that some employees in the workforce accept certain ideological concessions in order to go along with a pattern of cooperation that detracts, in some ways, from the public good as they understand it.

McMahon thinks that a liberal democratic governance procedure is practically essential for people to have sufficient reason to accept ideological concessions. Reasonableness -- what he calls "reasonableness in the concession sense" (pp. 73-5) -- is a normative ideal that requires people to make concessions in cooperative contexts when others are similarly disposed to make concessions.

In modern Western polities, the procedures of liberal democracy -- voting combined with civil and political rights that cannot easily be abridged by a majority vote -- are widely regarded as providing a reasonable way of resolving political disagreements, and this conviction seems to be supportable by competent reasoning. (p. 79) If an organization has a liberal democratic governance procedure, members should see this as a reasonable way of dealing with political disagreement, and they should see that reasonableness requires them to accept the ideological concessions that emerge out of the process.

Unfortunately, most corporations in our society do not have liberal democratic governance procedures, at least insofar as they are freestanding organizations. So instead of treating corporations as freestanding organizations, we can treat them as subordinate agencies of government. Understood in this way, the highest level of decision-making in every corporation actually occurs in the political legislature, and corporate executives make decisions as subordinates in a more encompassing system of social governance. To the extent that each corporation effectively has a liberal democratic governance procedure, employees have sufficient reason to make the necessary ideological concessions.

This is the legitimacy argument for public capitalism. The legitimacy of executive authority depends on liberal democratic governance, and subordination to the legislature is one way of inserting a liberal democratic governance procedure into every corporation.

Parallels with the Standard Economic View

When you first read McMahon's account of public capitalism, it sounds like a radical departure from the conventional view of the corporation. But on reflection, it is not as radical as it sounds. This is because the dominant approach to the morality of corporations in academic discussions appeals to economic theory, and economic theory takes for granted that the activity of corporations and corporate executives unfolds in the domain of "public" rather than "private" morality (see Hussain 2012).

According to the standard economic view, corporations form part of a more encompassing system of social coordination that promotes the public good. This broader system is based on the market. The government creates the market through the law, and the legal framework includes the various laws that create and shape the corporate form. Corporations must respect the independence of legislators, and if corporations have duties to shareholders, these are not duties of private morality, but legal obligations that ultimately serve to advance the public good. On the important points, then, the standard economic view agrees with McMahon that the corporation is a kind of government agency and that corporations are, in a certain sense, public officials.

From the perspective of political philosophy, public capitalism is really a variation on the standard economic view: both accounts see the corporation and corporate executives as part of a broader system of social coordination for the public good. What is distinctive about public capitalism is the role that it assigns to corporations in the system. The standard economic view says that the corporation should focus exclusively on pursuing profits within the framework of regulated competition in the market. But public capitalism rejects this in favor of the "bureaucratic" interpretation, which says that the corporation should aim directly at promoting the public good, and that it should shape its profit making activities in the market with this broader objective in mind.

How Important is the Legitimacy Argument?

Once we understand what is distinctive about public capitalism, we can get a better handle on how well the legitimacy argument supports the view. Let's grant the central conclusion of the legitimacy argument, namely that corporations are government agencies. Does it follow that corporations should use their authority in ways that aim directly at promoting the public good?

Consider another government agency, the National Institutes of Health (NIH). Suppose that Congress does not specifically decide that we should develop nuclear weapons to defend the country. Suppose that the NIH has several research facilities that could develop small-scale nuclear weapons technologies by slightly modifying their normal research activities. If the director of the NIH believes that nuclear weapons are essential to national defense, does the silence of the legislature imply that the NIH may use its laboratories to pursue these weapons technologies? Surely not.

Government agencies are not all-purpose organizations for promoting the public good. Agencies have specific functional roles to play in our system of social governance, roles that justify and constrain their authority. The NIH's role is to conduct basic medical research to improve health, increase longevity, and reduce illness and disability. National defense may be an important social good and the activities of the NIH may potentially contribute to the good, but this does not mean that the NIH can take national defense into account in exercising its authority over researchers and equipment. National defense is just not part of the NIH's portfolio.

The implication is that even if we accept the central conclusion of the legitimacy argument, i.e., that corporations are government agencies, it does not follow that corporations should aim at promoting the public good through their activities. Much like the NIH, corporations will have specific roles to play in our system of social governance, and it may turn out that their role is simply to maximize profits within the framework of a competitive market. An argument for public capitalism cannot simply show that corporations are government agencies; it must show why the functional role of these agencies is different from what the standard economic view says it is.

A Critique of Market Governance

This brings us to what I believe is really at the heart of McMahon's book. The case for public capitalism does not rest fundamentally on a view about the legitimacy of executive authority, but rather on a specific critique of market governance.

McMahon does not develop the critique as fully and forcefully as he develops the public model of legitimacy, but the critique goes something like this (see especially chapter 5, pp. 144-57). Even when the market system works perfectly, it works only to advance one social good, namely prosperity. As a side effect, it may also promote or detract from other social goods: for example, the market may produce drugs that improve public health and pollution that damages the environment. But given the importance of these other social goods, we should not understand the functional role of the corporation simply as pursuing profits within the framework of market competition. In order to advance the public good as a whole, we should think of the functional role of the corporation as pursuing profits in the market as one part of a broader effort to promote the public good.

Unlike the legitimacy argument, the critique of market governance gives us a reason to think that the functional role of the corporation in social governance is different from what the standard economic view says it is. Since market competition has fundamental limits as a mechanism for promoting the public good, it does not make sense for corporations to confine their activity to profit making in the market.

McMahon's critique of market governance is fundamental and important: once you take seriously the idea that the environment, human health, and other goods have inherent value, independent of consumer preferences, you have to rethink many aspects of market governance.

I am not so sure, however, that public capitalism is the right response. There are many issues to consider here, one of which has to do with the scope of executive authority. By confining the corporation to the market sphere, the traditional model of market governance puts certain limits on the scope of executive authority. But public capitalism basically removes these constraints. For example, according to public capitalism, there is no reason in principle why an executive at JPMorgan could not just order his employees to go out and waterproof the Brooklyn Bridge. If the legislature does not forbid banks working on bridges, and the work would not undermine the financial viability of the bank, then the bank executive could commandeer his employees to perform this public service. But I think that employees would be right to object. If the corporation becomes an all-purpose organization for promoting the public good, employees will have to act not only on the business judgments of executives, but also on their judgments about the public good. This intensifies the subordination of employees to executives. Furthermore, in a democratic society, people should be able to find employment without having to sign on to someone else's political agenda. Finally, if you think that corporate executives are tiresome egomaniacs now, just wait till they see themselves as the heads of social movements!


Corporate executives wield enormous authority in our society, and Public Capitalism is a very sophisticated exploration of the moral dimensions of this authority. The defense of public capitalism may not be fully developed, but McMahon's critique of market governance raises many important questions and makes a significant contribution to our understanding of the morality of corporate life.



Hussain, W. (2012) "Corporations, Profit Maximization and the Personal Sphere." Economics and Philosophy 28: 311-331.