Punishment, Compensation, and Law

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Mark R. Reiff, Punishment, Compensation, and Law, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 272pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521846692.

Reviewed by Douglas Husak, Rutgers University


Mark Reiff's Punishment, Compensation, and Law certainly is original. I intend this remark as high praise. Most books about punishment and compensation are maddeningly predictable and repetitive. They recite standard objections to familiar theories, add a new twist here or there, and defend an alternative no more plausible than those they reject. Reiff is doing something very different, and even those readers who have thought long and hard about the philosophical foundations of punishment and compensation will be challenged to come to terms with his ideas. Since Reiff poses questions and provides answers that are new, any legal philosopher interested in these matters will be stimulated by his unusual perspective. Although I sometimes wonder whether there really is a single theme under which he can subsume each of the several topics he examines, Reiff unquestionably has taken a novel approach to many important but frequently unaddressed problems in the philosophy of law.

Much of the originality is due to the distinctive set of questions Reiff addresses. Most discussions of punishment and compensation involve issues of justification. Theorists struggle to formulate and defend principles of retributive and compensatory justice. But Reiff is less interested in matters of justification than in distinct but related considerations about the enforceability of restraints (mostly but not only rights). At its most abstract level, Reiff's central question is "how much enforcement is required to make a restraint operative in the world." (p.3) Obviously, operative is the key word here. According to Reiff, restraints are operative (or meaningful) when they achieve their goals. A right that is enforceable according to his consequentialist criteria qualifies as genuine; otherwise, it is merely a nominal right. Nominal rights are not altogether insignificant, as Reiff assures us in a brief concluding chapter. Still, there can be no doubt that he believes enforceability is the key to making restraints meaningful in the real world.

Reiff proposes to keep issues of whether restraints are enforceable distinct from questions about what restraints we should impose. This separation makes analytical sense, but renders his project somewhat less interesting than it might have been (at least to me). Difficulties in imagining acceptable means of enforcing restraints against the use of contraceptives, for example, were instrumental in persuading the Supreme Court to find these restraints in violation of a constitutional right of privacy. These issues remain in the forefront of political and legal debate in the United States. But this is not the direction Reiff chooses to pursue.

Reiff's most important insight is that the goals of enforceability differ depending on whether we are in a previolation or postviolation state of affairs. (He also discusses a postenforcement stage, but it plays a much smaller role in his argument.) Begin with previolation enforceability. Inspired by Hobbes, Reiff asks us to imagine a possible world in which some or all of our rights are unenforceable. Since many of the advantages of social life would be impossible in such a place, Reiff maintains that the general goal of previolation enforceability should be to facilitate social cooperation. Rights become meaningful when this level of enforcement is achieved. It would be mistaken to suppose that this goal is reached when sanctions are sufficient to deter potential violators. Instead, Reiff claims that the attainment of this goal must be assessed from the perspective of the rights beneficiary. In other words, social cooperation is facilitated when beneficiaries rationally believe that potential violators will prefer not to enter the postviolation state, and thus behave as if the probability of violation were acceptable to them. Besides deterring violators, another way to encourage rational beneficiaries to undertake the risks of cooperation is by promising them enough compensation to make them indifferent to the possibility that a violation will occur. For a variety of principled and practical reasons that Reiff describes in lucid detail, however, genuine indifference is nearly impossible to produce. Thus the promise of compensation will seldom be sufficient to render a right enforceable in the previolation world, and threats of punishment often must do the job.

The goal of enforcement changes, however, after a violation of rights has taken place. In the postviolation stage, a system of enforcement should not try to facilitate social cooperation as much as to contain subsequent conflict, making it minimally disruptive to the social fabric. Thus an effective system of postviolation enforcement must satisfy the victim's instinct for retaliation while promoting containment rather than expansion of the conflict. The key to containment is acceptance of the results by both violators and beneficiaries. Among the more controversial parts of Reiff's book is his claim about how much punishment retributivists should require in the postviolation stage in order for acceptance to occur. Reiff rejects the familiar idea that the severity of punishment should be proportionate to the seriousness of the crime. Instead, he argues that rights are enforceable in the postviolation world when the severity of punishment is proportionate to the degree of suffering caused by the violation. This measure of retribution, he contends, should be acceptable to rational violators and beneficiaries alike because of reciprocity. That is, "the violator is not only a violator of this particular right, he is also the beneficiary of a great many other rights… He therefore has reason to view this amount of enforcement as just and accept his punishment." (p.144)

It is hard to tell whether Reiff has correctly identified the sorts of considerations that actually account for the tendency of violators and beneficiaries to accept the severity of sanctions, and thus to preserve a stable society over time. He draws heavily from game theory to support his claims, but we all know that ordinary persons depart radically from the models of rationality presupposed by economic models. The real world is far more messy. How often do people actually resort to vigilante justice, and why don't they do so more or less frequently? How much confidence in the efficacy of law enforcement must citizens lose before social cooperation is threatened? How do attitudes about the enforceability of particular rights affect views about the enforceability of whole systems of rights? Although Reiff generally seems to be making empirical claims about the forces that enhance or undermine social stability, his project is strangely devoid of empirical data. What really happens when the police go on strike, the jails are emptied, the electricity fails, or the occupying conquerors arrest all of the judges and politicians? How does the conduct of adolescents differ when they believe adults are not watching, and why don't they simply do whatever brings them immediate gratification? How fast do drivers go when specific speed limits are repealed, and how does the reintroduction of speed limits alter their behavior? Perhaps we have too little real-world experience with systems of norms that do not adequately contain the social conflict that might be anticipated if restraints were widely regarded as unenforceable. But I am skeptical that our philosophical armchairs provide a good vantage point from which we can understand the variables that help to attain the goals of social stability and the containment of social conflict.

Reiff's ambition is to produce a unified and comprehensive theory of enforceability. Indeed, his view is admirably comprehensive in many respects, most notably in its coverage of both criminal and civil law. Most theorists treat these realms as almost completely distinct, governed by different principles of justice. Reiff, however, offers an intriguing hypothesis about the connection between punishment and compensation. In the previolation state of affairs, the availability of compensation will render a restraint enforceable only occasionally. Compensation plays a far more central role in explaining postviolation enforceability. In the postenforcement state of affairs, some amount of compensation can reduce the quantum of punishment needed to make a right enforceable. Any reservations we are likely to have about allowing the payment of compensation to reduce the amount of punishment required probably derive from our failure to keep questions of enforceability distinct from questions of justification.

But Reiff's discussion strikes me as less than comprehensive in another sense. It is largely inapplicable, I think, to many and perhaps most of the restraints imposed by our legal system today. Reiff's proposal to assess many questions of enforceability from the perspective of the rights beneficiary presupposes that such a person exists. As Reiff is aware, however, many of the laws enforced most commonly against individuals under existing law lack an identifiable rights beneficiary. What does it mean, for example, for restraints on acts of solicitation and conspiracy to be enforceable? But we need not focus on inchoate offenses to appreciate the limited scope of Reiff's analysis. How should we decide whether restraints on such activities as illicit drug distribution are enforceable? Consider the kinds of questions that might have arisen had Reiff kept this latter example in mind. Is a restraint enforceable in a meaningful and operative sense when it is applied with a great deal of discretion, and selectively invoked against minorities in particular? Might one and the same restraint be enforceable in one community but not in another? Could enforcement actually do more to undermine than to facilitate social cooperation? Are the real goals of enforcing this restraint more sinister than Reiff acknowledges? At what point do we concede that efforts to enforce given restraints have failed? Despite his claims to comprehensiveness, Reiff's theory, as far as I can tell, lacks the resources to answer such questions.

Although Reiff frequently seeks to identify the practical implications of his ambitious project, I would be more inclined to recommend this book to academic theoreticians than to makers of public policy. Each of Reiff's discussions displays an impressive wealth of philosophical sophistication. But the whole endeavor is so riddled with qualifications and refinements that I fear it becomes largely inapplicable to those entrusted with shaping policy in the real world. He admits, for example, that we are almost always in the previolation and postviolation stages simultaneously. To his great credit, Reiff is aware of nearly all of these complexities, and adds several distinctions that readers may not have been inclined to draw. Despite these concessions, he cannot quite bring himself to admit that most of his exercise is academic. On a scholarly level, at least, Reiff has produced a valuable and original contribution to our understanding of whether and under what conditions given restraints can be said to be enforceable.