Purpose in the Living World? Creation and Emergent Evolution

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Jacob Klapwijk, Purpose in the Living World? Creation and Emergent Evolution, Harry Cook (ed., tr.), Cambridge UP, 2008, ix + 311pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521729437.

Reviewed by Christopher V. Mirus, University of Dallas



The creation-evolution debate is, to put it bluntly, a bit trying. To open one’s mouth respectably requires at least some competence in evolutionary science, in Christian theology, and of course in philosophy as well. And none of these specializations can be reduced to a set of doctrines to be learned, or of arguments and conclusions to be mastered. For devout Christians of a certain sort, even a rather modest naturalism appears a foreign landscape. But apart from this landscape — this network of understandings and expectations forged in the minds of scientists through long and disciplined commerce with nature — one cannot even begin to make sense of the claims made by evolutionary theory. They can appear only as a myth written to confuse and mystify humans beings, to deprive them of faith in the God who saves. Conversely, to a mind formed exclusively by evolutionary naturalism, biblical faith in creation seems at best an idealistic conviction adopted by intuition or whimsy, and at worst the antechamber to bigotry and superstition.

For those weary of the misunderstanding, Jacob Klapwijk — professor emeritus of philosophy at the Free University, Amsterdam — offers a welcome contribution to the discussion. In Purpose in the Living World? Creation and Emergent Evolution, Klapwijk takes aim at “evolutionary naturalism” (understood as a form of reductive physicalism), and draws on a tradition of Dutch Christian philosophy to develop what he calls a general theory of emergent evolution (GTEE). Briefly put, the GTEE holds that the history of life has been marked by a series of irreducible novelties. Life itself is novel in relation to what came before it; so are plant life, sentience, and humanity. Each is irreducible to the modes of being from which it emerged. This is one half of the theory. The other, nearly as important, is that each such novelty has appeared as a result of evolutionary continuity at lower levels. Without continuity of cellular evolution, plants could not have emerged; without the same sort of continuity among animals, human beings would not have existed.

Philosophical readers of Klapwijk’s book may, despite his protests, discern strong echoes of one or another form of nonreductive physicalism. Even for such readers, however, the book may prove interesting, for in addition to GTEE itself — which is a coherent theory, developed with exemplary balance and restraint — Klapwijk provides insightful reflections on science, philosophy and faith; on the nature of time; and on the hermeneutic value for science of both Christian faith and evolutionary naturalism. He is also remarkably well read, discussing with equal facility Heidegger and the Churchlands, Popper and Augustine. In short, he speaks from a lifetime of careful reflection in which many competing voices have found a respectful ear.

From an ontological point of view, the central concept of GTEE is that of a “modality”, of which we may take sentience as an example. Evolutionary novelty means the presence of a new, higher-level modality, made possible through evolutionary changes at lower levels; in an entity that exists at more than one modal level, what happens at each level is correlative to, but causally separate from, what happens at the others. Each level is characterized by “modal laws” that govern, universally or piecemeal, the behavior of entities existing at that level; for this reason Klapwijk calls modal levels “idionomic”. The emergence of a modality, finally, creates a new “modal sphere” in the world: with the emergence of sentience, for example, the physical and living worlds acquire an entirely new meaning, their meaning as objects of sensation.

Despite Klapwijk’s insistence on novelty, and thus on distinct ontological levels, he rejects any hint of essentialism. The living forms at each modal level are, for GTEE, as fluid as experience and scientific reflection render them. Modal laws do not imply type laws, and species are characterized not by essences but by “variable patterns of durability” (238). Klapwijk is willing to extend this claim to the human case: it is an empirical question, he thinks, whether humanity emerged gradually or all at once. His rejection of essentialism is in keeping with his conception of philosophy, to which I now turn.

For most of the book, Klapwijk’s view of philosophy remains in the background. It appears only through his persistent rejection of what he calls “metaphysics”. I hesitate, since this rejection of metaphysics is, as we have seen, quite compatible with the pursuit of ontology. He rejects metaphysics to embrace a flexible and open-ended empiricism that, like William James’s, admits religious experience as readily as it does scientific. Thus when he does turn to the nature of philosophy he writes:

Philosophy is anti-metaphysical because and in so far as it distantiates itself from the super-empirical world as it was presented in classical, medieval, and early-modern philosophy. Today’s philosophy does not lend itself to theoretical speculations about the first principles, the divine foundation or the higher purpose of being, or about the hidden essences of things. Philosophers have discovered that the scientific search for a world that transcends the possibilities of human experience is meaningless (239).

(The word “distantiates”, I should add, is not typical of translator and editor Harry Cook’s lively and engaging rendition of Klapwijk’s Dutch.)

This may seem strange fare, served up by a Christian thinker whose theology appears to be fairly orthodox. But to begin with, the Kantian language that Klapwijk uses to describe philosophy does not signal that his ontology should be taken nonrealistically. Philosophy is for him a “reflective-empirical” project that investigates the constitutive principles of experience — but above all, its ontological principles. This view of philosophy grounds, by the way, Klapwijk’s version of Plantinga’s argument that evolutionary naturalism is self-defeating: in denying the uniqueness of human thought, it removes the ontological conditions in which truth claims, and thus scientific theories, can be made and defended. In short, Klapwijk is a realist about both science and God.

He rejects, however, as he reminds us more than once, the traditional project of natural theology. Klapwijk’s God is the God of the Bible, not of the philosophers, and his religious epistemology is relentlessly Protestant. God reveals himself not to speculative philosophy but through his presence in human history, and he is recognized in that history by faith alone. Thus for example intelligent design theory is, for Klapwijk, simply the latest incarnation of the logos doctrine of Greek philosophy, which has infected Christian thought for far too long. Yes, humans (even materialists) share an aspiration toward some sort of ultimate reality, but God is transcendent, and our religious aspirations can reach him only through revelation and faith.

What are we to make of Klapwijk’s aversion to metaphysics? He is right, of course, to criticize intelligent design as a clumsy and inadequate theory. But his facile rejection of ideas so central to Christian intellectual tradition is a bit disappointing — especially since “the devastating critique by David Hume and Immanuel Kant of the credibility of metaphysics”, to which he appeals, led those thinkers to reject not just metaphysics, but anything like truth in the ordinary sense (27). His appeals to Scripture to support his rejection of natural theology are no less one-sided; he does not even mention the words of St. Paul in Romans 1 that have inspired so many Christian thinkers.

Still, those who view natural theology more optimistically should not ignore Klapwijk’s book. His ontology is interesting, and in any case the relation between faith and reason is richer and more complex than textbook Aquinas would suggest. Klapwijk provides important reflections on the hermeneutic value of faith, particularly but not only Protestant faith, for science and for philosophy. Moreover, he is right about natural theology to this extent: it is indeed a dicey business, and its best practitioners are as insistent on the via negativa as they are that creation points to a creator.

Analytic metaphysicians may also, though less often, feel provoked by Klapwijk, as when he argues (all too briefly) that because causality is level-bound, there can be no such thing as bottom-up or top-down causation; thus nonreductive physicalism “is, in my judgment, more a pseudo-scientific mantra than a fully considered scientific position” (145). In his defense, however, it is not really part of Klapwijk’s project to resolve thorny questions about causality. His philosophical project truly is “reflective-empirical”, in the sense that it struggles above all simply to make room in the human mind for the world as it presents itself to us. Whether or not this is the whole of philosophy, it is surely where we ought to begin.

I end by considering Klapwijk’s title, Purpose in the Living World? That is, does evolutionary science provide evidence for a divine purpose at work in the world? The question mark in the title is appropriate, for as we might expect given his view of natural theology, Klapwijk’s answer is extremely cautious. What he does say presupposes a certain conception of time and of creation, drawn from Augustine and articulated in the book’s opening chapters as a hermeneutic horizon for what follows. (It is ironic that in distancing himself from the tradition of Christian metaphysics, Klapwick takes as his patron the thinker who did more than any other to introduce Platonic metaphysics into western Christian thought, but on these aspects of Augustine’s thought Klapwijk is silent.) God, he holds with Augustine, is transcendent; he is therefore outside time; time itself is his creature. So time must be understood, and with it evolution, as a progressive manifestation of God’s plan for creation.

For this faith-inspired view of time and history Klapwijk claims no more than a hermeneutic significance for science. By contrast with the reductive naturalism that he rejects, it fosters an openness to the richness and diversity of what history brings forth, and so a truly empirical outlook. The question that remains is, can science itself detect in nature traces of God’s presence? He approaches this question by asking, in particular, whether science can perceive a direction to evolution. His cautious answer is that science can discover the ways in which evolutionary transformations at one level, however random they may appear in themselves, make possible and thereby anticipate the emergence of higher modes of being. Science cannot, however, extrapolate from these cases of “anticipation” any conclusions about where nature and history are going, nor can it conclude positively that such anticipations express a divine plan. Science and philosophy thus lead us up to the veil; faith, which is no less human than science, must do the rest.