Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus

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John M. Cooper, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus, Princeton University Press, 2012, 442pp. $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691159706.

Reviewed by Rachana Kamtekar, University of Arizona


John Cooper acquaints the reader with major philosophers of antiquity: Socrates, Aristotle, the Epicureans, Stoics, Skeptics and Plotinus. (Plato is omitted, except that the so-called 'Socratic' dialogues serve as a source for our knowledge of Socrates, and the Phaedo and Republic serve as background for understanding Plotinus; the reason for this omission is Plato's writing only dialogues in the voices of others, with 'unresolved conflicts and contradictions' between the various dialogues (67).) Cooper hopes to make these philosophers 'accessible to philosophers, and students of philosophy, with little or no familiarity with specialist scholarship' and 'to readers interested in philosophy, and in the idea of philosophy as a guide to life, with little formal background in the academic field' (xi), and to

show . . . how good and strong these philosophies are in strictly philosophical terms . . . but also . . . how clear, and even compelling, these philosophies are as potential guides to living, for anyone who has any inclination to live their life on the basis of reasons they can understand and approve, after critical reflection of their own concerning what reason itself tells us about how we should live. (x)

However, it is not only non-specialists, but also specialist students of ancient philosophy, who should find a book of this sort exciting: what does a lifetime's scholarly work in ancient philosophy show to be of continuing relevance and value today?

The book's distinctive thesis is that in antiquity, 'philosophy was widely pursued as not just the best guide to life but as both the intellectual basis and the motivating force for the best human life' (2, Cooper's emphasis). Cooper uses a comparison and contrast with contemporary moral philosophy to make precise 'motivating force': moral philosophy as taught and used today is practically guiding (5), but in antiquity philosophy was thought to be 'the art or discipline that develops and perfects the human capacity of reason' so that 'when one does possess a completely grounded philosophical understanding of the full truth about how to live, by living one's life through that understanding one achieves the finally and fully satisfactory life for a human being' (6). In the 'quasi-technical terms of philosophy' (xi) that Cooper eschews: today moral philosophy claims at most to be instrumentally valuable insofar as it enables its users to make the right choices; in antiquity, by contrast, having and/or acting on a perfected rational capacity was thought to be intrinsically valuable, indeed, to constitute the goodness of a life (and of choices made in that life). Cooper identifies three ancient assumptions about reason that underlie the distinctive conception of philosophy as a way of life: that reason motivates (11), that philosophy perfects reason (12), and that the perfection of reason guarantees success in action (14). Modern philosophers, by contrast, suppose there to be a psychological gap between thought and action, and this prevents them from accepting philosophy as a way of life (15). But the ancient assumptions may be true, and so the student who hopes philosophy will change his life for the better should study ancient philosophy (16).

Pursuits of Wisdom takes up but significantly revises Pierre Hadot's characterization of philosophy as a way of life (e.g., Philosophy as a Way of Life, 1995; What is Ancient Philosophy?, 2002). Where Hadot treated 'spiritual exercises' as central to the way of life that was ancient philosophy, Cooper maintains that what is central is reasoning, argument, and understanding. We need to know what Hadot means by 'spiritual exercises' if we are to be able to evaluate Cooper's revision, but Cooper only cites the definition 'voluntary, personal practices, intended to bring about a transformation of the individual, a transformation of the self' (402, endnote 5), which does not seem to exclude reasoned argument or contemplation of fundamental truths. To characterize spiritual exercises, Hadot himself draws on lists from Philo of Alexandria:

research (zetesis), thorough investigation (skepsis), reading (anagnosis), listening (akroasis), attention (prosoche), self-mastery (enkrateia), indifference to indifferent things, meditations (meletai), therapies of the passions, remembrance of good things, and the accomplishment of duties. (Philosophy as a Way of Life, tr. Chase, 84).

It is true that Hadot's examples come from later Stoic writers such as Epictetus, Marcus, and Seneca, but that is the case with a lot of our evidence for Stoicism. Hadot also cites the Epicurean pre-rehearsal of future evils (Philosophy as a Way of Life, 85), but Cooper dismisses Epicurus as 'a very special case' (402, endnote 4). So perhaps Cooper's complaint is that Hadot is too inclusive, counting as 'philosophy' too much that is not reasoning or argumentation. It seems to me that Hadot does not emphasize enough ancient philosophy's commitment to the truth -- about the world as much as about ourselves -- but then, neither does Cooper, focusing instead on how the processes and activities of reasoning, rationally arguing, and understanding perfect our rational capacities. It seems to me that this last is an over-specification of the role of reason in the philosophical life, one result of which is a loss of coherence in Cooper's overall project. For example, as I show below, although the Epicureans, Skeptics and even Socrates are included in the book as offering philosophical ways of life, Cooper's narrow conception of philosophy disqualifies them.

Cooper, following (he says) Plato's Socrates, claims that 'philosophy' is 'self-consciously devoted to rigorous reasoning and rationally disciplined inquiry' and 'involves a commitment to logical reasoning as the fundamental method for the formation of respectable beliefs' (30). This is unobjectionable, but the contrast Cooper has in mind, which sometimes surfaces, is not. He says, for example, that philosophy is 'fundamentally committed to the use of one's own capacity for reasoning in living one's life', with the result that 'A mere feeling of conviction that some way of living is the right one, induced for example through prayer or through a sense of having a personal relationship with a higher than human power, will not do' (18). But a contrast with religion does not seem to be the contrast Socrates or his successors had in mind when they characterized philosophy. In Plato's 'Socratic' dialogues, the contrast seems to be between sophists, claimants to wisdom, and the lover of wisdom; in Republic V, the contrast seems to be between the 'lovers of sights and sounds' who are concerned with the many things we experience, and one concerned with the true natures underlying these many experienced things. In Plato's Apology, rather than opposing reason to the 'higher than human power' with whom he has a 'personal relationship', Socrates defers to his daimonion's warnings (31c-d) and treats the Oracle's claim that he is the wisest as requiring an interpretation on which it must come out true (21b, as Cooper agrees, 39). In this context, reason's role is to interpret rather than to be the final authority.

The characterization of philosophy as fundamentally committed to rational inquiry is based on Cooper's image of Socrates, for whom 'philosophical reflection and analysis concerning the human good, as well as concerning human deficiencies, dictate a . . . way of life. . . . [that] is, practically speaking, though not in theory, the best for a human being.' (50) In theory, the best life is a life in which one possesses wisdom, but, as Socrates must have discovered through experience, 'wisdom is too demanding a goal for us to attain in practice' (51). What is the textual evidence that Socrates drew such a pessimistic conclusion about the attainability (as opposed to his and his contemporaries' actual attainment) of wisdom? Certainly the overwhelming evidence from the 'Socratic' dialogues is that he conceived of the value of inquiry as instrumental to the acquisition of wisdom. In response to the apparent futility of engaging in inquiry when you believe that knowledge is impossible, Cooper would presumably cite the value of perfecting our reason; however, this does not seem to be a self-sufficient goal for any ancient philosopher, but to require a grasp of fundamental truths about the world.

Cooper's idea that philosophy as a way of life requires the activities of reasoning (arguing, understanding for oneself) to constitute the goodness of that way of life has the unfortunate consequence of displacing the Epicureans and Pyrrhonist Skeptics from the list of those who proposed philosophy as a way of life in antiquity (even though Cooper puts them on that list). I say this because (1) Cooper argues that since the Epicureans think that what brings about peace of mind (ataraxia) is having the correct beliefs, an Epicurean can achieve ataraxia without having worked anything out for himself (274). (But note that an Epicurean can certainly give the same importance to argument and understanding that Socrates does in Plato's Meno [97e-98a] and on the same grounds: correct beliefs may guarantee ataraxia, but argument and understanding are needed to stabilize those correct beliefs.) Further, (2), Cooper observes that on Epicurus' conception, reason is

a purely naturally arising power of humans . . . that is firmly grounded in, and strictly limited by, our powers of sensation and feeling. . . . has no authority whatsoever except what derives from these sources. . . . consists simply in exercises of memory, and of restrained, wary generalization from sensory experience to what cannot be observed (227)

This humble conception of reason is connected to the Epicurean view that our world 'result[s] from random ways in which atoms swirling in the void happened to come together', to understand which 'there is . . . no recourse except to sensory observation and memory of that world, and how it can be seen to operate, plus modest extensions from that through cautious generalization, so as to cover parts of the world one has not had any sensory experience of' (228). But if the view that reason's activity constitutes our good depends on a cosmology according to which that same reason is the divine organizer of the world (whether by planning, as the Stoics think, or by contemplating and being imitated, as Aristotle thinks), what sorts of modern readers can Cooper expect to sign on to philosophy as a way of life?

As for the Pyrrhonist Skeptics, one would have thought that rational activity -- the balancing of equal and opposed reasons for believing so as to produce suspension of judgment -- is central to their way of life, even though ataraxia follows suspension 'fortuitously'. But Cooper says that the Skeptics reject the idea of believing anything for a reason (293). This seems unduly contentious: the Skeptics certainly admit that there are rational appearances, along with other kinds of appearances. What they do not do is give rational appearances blanket authority. And why is this not evidence that they alone live up to the standard of believing only when the reasons to believe are sufficient? Cooper might reply that the Skeptics do not maintain that the rationality of their activity makes it good, but should this be a requirement for any way of life to count as philosophical?

A windfall from Cooper's dissatisfaction with the Epicureans on philosophy as a way of life comes from his turning his attention away from this topic and offering a defense of Epicurus against some of Cicero's major criticisms. Cicero says that Epicurus thinks there are two kinds of pleasure -- 'kinetic' pleasures of being relieved from pain and 'katastematic' pleasures of having no pain -- of which the second isn't pleasure at all. Cooper replies that these are not two kinds, but rather two sources, of pleasure: the same feeling, pleasure, can be caused by bodily and psychic movements, or by awareness of one's state, with the second just as much as the first always characterized by some 'hedonic tone' (232-34). On this basis, Cooper provides an interpretation of Epicurus' obscure claim that when one has achieved the absence of pain, the pleasure cannot be increased, but only varied: pleasure can be varied by focusing on different items of awareness (one's state, particular activities, etc.).

This in turn allows Cooper to defend Epicurus against Cicero's charge that although living pleasantly requires friendship, 'friendship is impossible unless one has other values than pleasure (the friends' good for their own sake), and assigns that value weight independent of any relation to one's pleasure' (266). Friends contribute to the variety of our pleasures -- with friends we enjoy shared activities, interacting with each other and seeing to each other's pleasure (268-69). Friendship on such a basis certainly seems possible. However, Cooper's account may require attributing to us the desire for variety, or to avoid boredom (cf. 268), which does not appear on any list of the approved 'natural and necessary' or even 'natural' desires. And happiness may be a little less within reach if it requires not only the satisfaction of necessary bodily desires but also variety in the means of that satisfaction.

I turn now to the 'mainline' successors of Socrates for whom rational activity constitutes the goodness of the best life. In a lengthy chapter on Aristotle, Cooper argues that whether one lives a contemplative life (studying first principles and how the natural world, on the one hand, and the laws of thought, on the other, derive from them), or only a politically active or privately virtuous life (equipped with practical, or motivating, knowledge of the human good and how to realize it in particular circumstances and with others), one's way of life will be philosophical. That is to say, it will be guided by and motivated from perfected rational activity, which includes obedient appetitive and emotional feelings, and practical reasoning, as well as theoretical reasoning. Along the way Cooper defends the abstractness of Aristotle's account of the moral virtues (in particular the stress on each virtue's being a mean between two extremes that are vices, and the lack of concrete detail about the virtuous person's thoughts and feelings) as attesting to the fact that exercises of these virtues are exercises of reason (99-105).  He explains that the virtuous person values things other than virtue for their contribution to virtuous activity, has goodwill towards others and attitudes towards himself conducive to good interactions with others (105-16); and he argues that even a private individual should study legislation because to be a good human being involves living a virtuous life communally, so that one should raise one's children with a view to the constitution since their virtues need to be 'calibrated' to the life of their political community (123-37). It is a little difficult to keep focused on philosophy as ways of life through these discussions, so I will comment on just one basic point.

Cooper distinguishes the practical knowledge that is political science and that is gained by the sort of philosophical reflection contained in the Nicomachean Ethics and Politics from theoretical knowledge by a distinction between seeing some x as valuable and seeing that that x is valuable (74-79). The former is motivating. (It is not really clear why the latter is not  -- doesn't contemplation of the Prime Mover motivate the heavens to imitate its rational activity?). Cooper's claim that the habituation of our appetites and emotions to line up with our rational judgments is a prerequisite to the development of practical wisdom (77) leads one to suspect that a cluster of dispositions, some of them dispositions of reason and others dispositions of other capacities, is being renamed 'knowledge' or 'understanding'. Clarifying this might illuminate just how knowledge of the human good guarantees moral goodness. Cooper says that since the human good is rational activity, actions preferring health, wealth, or pleasure over what is rational constitute an abandonment of concern for one's own true good (89). But why can I not pursue my intellectual activities selfishly and inconsiderately? These seem to be the sorts of questions that would occur to the non-specialist reader at which this book is aimed, and it is unfortunate that they are not addressed or even acknowledged.

Similar problems of renaming and non-acknowledgement of questions arise for the chapter on Stoicism. Before concluding with a section on the 'way of life' theme, Cooper dilates on the Stoic conception of God and on Stoic moral psychology and theory of value. The main point seems to be that the Stoic ethical goal, living in agreement, is doing what Zeus, who has planned the world for the best, intends for one, which consists in understanding that the world's orderliness is good, and so unemotionally accepting what happens, and pursuing things that are according to nature (this last being determined by what is pursued by non-human animals and non-adult humans).

Here, Cooper seems keen to defend the 'shocking' Stoic rejection of the emotions as false judgments about the goodness or badness of indifferents, but he does so by renaming the judgments of appropriateness towards indifferents that the Stoics allow us. 'In Stoic theory,' he says, 'virtuous people like their food, desire the pleasure of it, and are as one may say "turned on" for it, when they virtuously desire it.' (199, my emphases) Of course, they do not think the food and the pleasure that comes from it are good, only of 'natural value to a human being', but the result is that 'the reasoned desires' from which virtuous persons act 'are infused with feeling.' (201). No Stoic text suggests anything like this. The Stoics do have a doctrine of 'good feelings' (eupatheiai), but these are attitudes towards genuine goods and evils (virtues, vices, and the actions and reactions that participate in them), not towards indifferents. Cooper is entitled to rename or redefine judgments as feelings, or to supplement Stoic theory, if he likes, but he ought to let the non-specialist reader know.

So much for renaming.  An example of non-acknowledgement is Cooper's silence on how Zeus's wonderful plan for the goodness of the whole world interacts with human vice. Cooper says that Zeus determines everything except our choices (178, 182), which a non-specialist might understand to mean that our choices are outside the causal nexus that is fate -- but can he mean this? Or does he think that our minds are parts of divine reason -- but how is that consistent with our ignorance and vice? Again, while Cooper explains that local misfortunes (e.g., your children die in a fire), serve the greater goodness and beauty of the cosmos, and so are to be accepted, he says nothing about how local evils (e.g., you grieve for your dead children) relate to this greater goodness.

Finally, a couple of observations about the 'Platonism' chapter, which describes Plotinus' metaphysics, conception of the human person, grades of virtue, and happiness, and emphasizes his 'otherworldliness', by which Cooper seems to mean his view that the person is the intellect whose true life and happiness lie in his intellectual life. Cooper contrasts this with Plato, for whom

Knowledge of Forms, on which philosophy concentrates, is, for us human beings, fundamentally aimed at allowing us to grasp and make sense of the world we live in as embodied rational animals -- that is, the physical world -- and of the natural and social events, and changing circumstances, that provide us with all the work of living our lives, as we pursue our own animal interests and our efforts to direct our nonrational desires and emotions and to do our actions in as virtuous a way as possible. (313, my emphasis)

If that were true, why would Plato characterize philosophy as training for death (Phaedo 67d-e)? For Plato, it is a beneficial consequence of knowledge of Forms that it enables philosophers to know the physical world (in the Phaedo) and to make sound judgments about the institutions and practices in the ideal community (in the Republic).  But surely the point of philosophy is that -- as Cooper has maintained in earlier chapters -- it perfects our human capacity for reason (and, I would add, puts us in contact with supremely valuable objects, unchanging fundamental truths). Cooper cites Socrates' criticism of suicide in the Phaedo as evidence of Plato's 'commit[ment] to life in this material world and to legitimate animal and social satisfactions' (315), but the reason Socrates gives against suicide is that, as possessions of the gods, we should remain at our station until required to leave (62b-c). Had Cooper written a chapter on philosophy as a way of life in Plato, who sometimes characterizes the ideal as likeness to god, he might have developed a more accurate Plato-Platonism contrast.

In his epilogue, 'The Demise of Pagan Philosophy, and of Philosophy as a Way of Life,' Cooper tells how Iamblichus 'added to Platonism, in a way not essentially different from the Gnostics, ritualistic utterances and performances of a religious and (in the sense of the earlier philosophical tradition from Socrates to Plotinus) unphilosophical kind' (385). The resulting 'contamination of philosophy by religion' (386) meant that by Augustine's time, the options for ways of life were a 'philosophized pagan religion' and a 'philosophized Christian one'; philosophy as a way of life was 'already dead' (387). But according to Augustine himself, it was reading Cicero's exhortation to philosophy, Hortensius, which set him on fire, not for this or that sect, but for wisdom (Confessions 3.4). It is true that Augustine concludes that this wisdom is knowledge of the Christian God, but Augustine too has a fundamental commitment to believing for reasons and to the idea that our perfection lies in wisdom, and Cooper's 'mainline' ancients, too, conclude that the highest wisdom is knowledge of God. Augustine may be constrained by more text than was Socrates, and by more doctrinal commitments, but these seem to be differences in degree rather than kind. If there is a fundamental change here between ways of life, it is not satisfactorily captured by saying that it is a change from philosophy to philosophized religion.

Pursuits of Wisdom is a stimulating book, engaged with important questions in the history of philosophy and rich in individual insights. More hands-on editing might have helped produce something easier to read, but the substance of the book makes it well worth the effort.


I would like to thank Tad Brennan and Stephen Menn for their comments on this review; however, they should not be assumed to share the views I express here.