Qu'est-ce qu'un peuple libre?: Libéralisme ou républicanisme

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Alain Renaut, Qu'est-ce qu'un peuple libre?: Libéralisme ou républicanisme, Grasset, 2005, 268pp., €17.90 (paper), ISBN 2246654912.

Reviewed by Daniel Weinstock , Université de Montréal


Anyone who has had a hand in political philosophy debates both in France and in the Anglo-American world know that they have at least since the Second World War developed in complete isolation from one another. Worse, the sense that practitioners of both debates have that their own tradition is the most philosophically serious has tended to be purchased at least in part on the basis of a caricatured view of what the other side was up to. It took sixteen years for John Rawls' Theory of Justice to get published in French, and the texts that are central to French philosophical debates struggle to find English-language publishers.

Alain Renaut's book Qu'est-ce qu'un peuple libre? is thus particularly welcome. For notwithstanding its philosophical virtues, which are many, Renaut sets out to show not only that Francophone and English-speaking political philosophers can learn from one another, but also that an adequate political philosophy positively requires that insights drawn from both traditions be integrated into a coherent philosophical whole.

Renaut's argument proceeds in two stages. The first part of the book is devoted to what he terms an "archaeology of republicanism". By tracing the republican tradition back to its roots in Aristotle and Roman texts, he demonstrates that the particular form of republicanism that has taken hold in French political and intellectual life is just that: a particular expression of a theoretical tradition that can manifest itself through a variety of distinct institutional embodiments without betraying its core normative commitment.

What is republicanism's central normative commitment? It is a commitment to government aimed at the common good, rather than at the conjunction of individual goods. Various means can be imagined to this end, and the French political imagination has focused resolutely on just one of these sets of means, to the point where, in Renaut's estimation, means have come to be taken as ends.

The institutional embodiment of the republican ideal that has become orthodox in France revolves, first, around the notion of citizen virtue. The guiding idea here is that if one wants politics to be governed by the common good, then citizens themselves must be educated in such a way as to be motivated by the common good, rather than by their own contingent good. Closely associated with this is a commitment to positive freedom, in the sense understood by Isaiah Berlin, according to which freedom consists in overcoming one's enslavement to one's passions and contingent interests. Finally, French republicanism is wary of the institution of political representation, as it is of any political mechanism that stands in the way of citizens being able to bring their republican virtue directly to bear upon political decision-making. The paradigmatic expression of French republicanism is clearly to be found in the work of Rousseau.

Renaut contrasts this particular expression of republicanism with one that achieves republican ends through indirection, by institutional design rather than individual virtue. The paradigmatic text here is The Federalist Papers, a book that has received rather scant attention in France, but that Renaut rightly sees as integral to the republican tradition. The authors of the Federalist, and in particular James Madison, were quite convinced that human passions had to be taken as they are, and that the hope of reforming human nature through education is doomed. Republican institutional design must, to quote the oft-quoted phrase, "economize on virtue", and channel individual interest to collective ends. Thus the Rousseauean preference for a small face-to-face state, devoid of the plague of faction, where republican virtue can be exercised in an unmediated fashion, is replaced with an argument for larger states, where the multiplicity of faction is viewed as desirable, on the grounds that where factions are many, none will be able to dominate. The various "checks and balances" famously described in Federalist are other instances of mechanisms that attempt to realize the common good as a "system effect" of well-designed institutions.

Renaut evinces a strong preference for the second of these ways of realizing republican ends, for it is much more hospitable than its French counterpart to pluralism and individual freedom. French republicans have tended to see pluralism as a threat rather than as a resource, and have tended to be statists rather than defenders of individual freedom. And so, he argues, once one sees that French republicanism is just one of several ways in which republicanism can be institutionalized, only chauvinism stands in the way of French political philosophers embracing a more liberal republicanism.

The first part of the book might end up being of ethnographic rather than philosophical interest to the English-speaking reader, as it is really addressed to a French audience, and aims to shake French political philosophers out of what Renaut views as a species of dogmatic slumber. The second part of the book, however, speaks directly to Anglo-American concerns, arguing that Rawlsian liberals should be republican liberals.

It begins with a confrontation with Philip Pettit's recent reformulation of the republican project around the key concept of liberty as non-domination. Pettit claims that this view is an amendment of the negative conception of freedom, as defined by Isaiah Berlin. It is not enough to say of a person that she is free in that no obstacles oppose her being able to do as she pleases. Freedom also requires that no agent be able to impose obstacles upon her arbitrarily. Thus the slave whose master through goodness of heart or simple neglect does not impose his will upon him is not really free.

The implication of this, in Pettit's view, is that constraints and laws that are not arbitrary are not really limitations upon freedom. Renaut argues that this aspect of the view makes Pettit's theory anti-liberal. For it is in his view a fundamental commitment of all liberal views that they view coercive laws as impediments to freedom -- necessary impediments perhaps, but impediments nonetheless.

But the main confrontation in this section is with Rawlsian liberalism. Renaut reclaims the Tocquevillean critique of American society, and generalizes it to the kind of society that might emerge from the realization of Rawlsian ideas. Renaut's concern is the sociological one that liberal societies committed to individual liberty will not be able to generate the basis of their own support, and that they might end up lapsing into an unattractively solipsistic individualism. After having canvassed a number of ways in which this tendency might be averted, Renaut argues that liberal societies can avoid lapsing into douces tyrannies if citizens are somehow actively involved in the deliberation and debate surrounding the laws that govern them, rather than seeing these laws simply as instruments externally provided to protect individual pursuits. Renaut thus finds himself invoking the contemporary school of theories referred to as "deliberative democratic", which require a real involvement of citizens in the affairs of government. Thus, having argued in the first part of the book that republicanism must be liberalized by integrating what is, from the French point of view, the "lost" republican tradition of Madisonianism, he now argues that liberalism must be "republicanized" by attending to the conditions that will prevent liberal societies from degenerating into a morally unattractive form of individualism.

The importance of this book lies in its demonstration of the degree to which philosophical chauvinisms must be overcome in order for philosophical progress to occur. And this demonstration is carried out brilliantly by Renaut, who not only shows that both French and Anglo-American traditions have much to learn from one another, but that, in a sense, the whole idea of there being separate philosophical traditions in the area of political philosophy carrying out distinct projects must also give way.

Like all good books, Qu'est-ce qu'un peuple libre? raises more questions than it answers. I want here to flag three. The first is exegetical, and has to do with Renaut's rather rapid dismissal of Pettit's republicanism as unacceptably illiberal. I believe this impression is based on too limited a reading of Pettit's theory of freedom, and an insufficient consideration of the broader philosophical project of which it is a part. Part of the way, after all, in which laws come to be seen as non-arbitrary constraints upon freedom comes from their being couched in an institutional context that ensures checks and balances. In a complex institutional argument that obviously cannot be fully described in the context of a short review, Pettit shows that members of the public must be present in the elaboration of laws not as authors, but as "editors", who scrupulously examine laws so as to weed out ones whereby legislators might be found to be abusing their authority. Thus, the conception of freedom is embedded in a kind of institutional design of the kind that Renaut finds most admirable in the Federalist.

The second point has to do with the degree to which deliberation of the kind defended by deliberative democrats can really be taken as "republican". Deliberation has a more complicated relationship to the republican tradition than Renaut lets on. Rousseau explicitly disavows it, and not much place is made for it in the Madisonian version of republicanism that Renaut most admires. There are reasons internal to liberalism that militate against "going deliberative". In particular, the recognition of pluralism puts paid to the liberal pretension to be able to identify substantive constitutional norms constraining legislation in advance of deliberation. But it is unclear that the republican concern with the viability and stability of liberal institutions is served through deliberation, which might explain why it is largely absent from much republican theorizing in the modern era.

Finally, I would argue that the relationship of democratic deliberation to the republican goal of the common good is also problematic. Democracy is a messy affair, and there is no guarantee that it will give rise to policies that reflect the common good, unless it is heavily constrained. It is unsurprising that in both of its main variants, Habermasian on the one hand, and Anglo-American on the other, democratic talk only counts as deliberation if a number of fairly exigent requirements are satisfied both by democratic interlocutors and by the deliberative setting itself. What results is a highly artificial and stilted conception of democratic talk, one that is even less likely to perform the sociological, "Tocquevillean" functions that Renaut identifies as necessary correctives to standard liberalism than a more unfettered democracy might be, since citizens are called upon to contribute to deliberation not on the basis of what really matters to them (such things being ruled out of court by deliberativists as making the identification of democratic consensus more difficult), but rather on the basis of a rarified conception of political identity poles apart from their real, everyday, "encumbered" identities.

More democracy might serve to identify normative consensuses in plural societies. It might also serve to provide citizens with a "stake" in political institutions that will make society less likely to lapse into individualism. It also has intrinsic merits connected to the value of collective self-determination. Thus there is tension and pluralism built into the very idea of democracy, and it would be a mistake to try to call on democracy to realize all of the values that can possibly be connected with it at once.