Quantum Information Theory and the Foundations of Quantum Mechanics

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Christopher G. Timpson, Quantum Information Theory and the Foundations of Quantum Mechanics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 293pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199296460.

Reviewed by Gregg Jaeger, Quantum Communication and Measurement Laboratory, Boston University


The relationship between quantum information and the foundations of quantum mechanics has been of interest to philosophers of science and physicists for at least two decades. This relationship has arguably been known at least since the middle of the last century (e.g., Rothstein 1951, Plotnitsky 2010) and is now well recognized. Recently a number of related bold theses and misconceptions have appeared, such as “information is physical,” “the world is a quantum computer,” and “physics is information theory.” Before considering theses such as these, and philosophical issues relevant to them, the nature of information itself must be clarified. Christopher Timpson does just this in his new book. This alone would suffice to make it valuable reading for those interested in quantum information theory. But, the book goes beyond this, demonstrating the work needed to establish such theses is far from having been done, and is in some instances impossible. By its end, a number of specific proposals for placing the interpretation of quantum theory on an informational basis are shown to be far from having been accomplished.

The first part of the book deals primarily with information theory, providing a more careful discussion than is typically given in the quantum foundational literature. Timpson gives a critical assessment of various specific proposals for solving basic problems of quantum foundations, such as the measurement problem and the nature of quantum “non-locality.” In the case of the latter, for example, he makes evident that concern over the actualization of properties “at a distance” can be seen as having more to do with (a misunderstanding of) the nature of information than with the specifics of the physical processes involved. In its second portion, the focus turns primarily to quantum information theory and the ways and extent to which it differs from classical information. Timpson points out, for example, that the differences between quantum information and classical information turns on the difference of communication signal states available in the two theories (cf. Jaeger 2006). In its final portion, the book addresses issues in the foundations of quantum theory proper and assesses several relatively recent attempts to provide an informational foundation for the theory.

The book begins most basically and very helpfully by clearly pointing out that the term ‘information’ is an abstract noun and, so, does not refer to any particular or concrete substance that follows specific pathways, as might be thought from commonly used phrases such as “information flow” and “information transfer.” Understanding this single point alone helps one avoid a number of errors in physical situations in which information plays an important role. Timpson lays out the basics of information theory, beginning with the well-known Shannon quantification of information, which is carefully distinguished from the everyday conception, which itself has semantic and epistemic elements that the technical notion of Shannon information is said specifically not to have and which can also be greater or lesser in its own way. For example, Shannon explicitly disavowed any semantic element in his writings on communication and information, whereas the common-sense notion does have such an aspect.

In addressing the question of what information is, Timpson draws an important distinction between possessing information and containing information, which often arises in the discussion of communication and information processing, by pointing out that Shannon’s concept, which is given in the context of the communication of information between a sender of information and a receiver of information, rests essentially on the reproducibility of the information by the receiver of the transmission of the sender. In particular, the Shannon information produced by the sender is best understood via the abstract sequence of states, for example, states of a dichotomic variable, involved in the transmission rather than physical bearers of signals.

After these initial clarifications, the relationship of information to quantum theory is taken up through the presentation of the fundamentals of quantum information theory. Timpson’s presentation includes a discussion of the qubit in contradistinction to the better-known bit of information -- the latter being based on the notion of a distinct pair of states, whereas the former also includes states formed by quantum-mechanical superposition. The difference between these two is also evidenced by the difference in the ability to deterministically “clone” states, that is, the ability to produce a precise duplicate of a pure state: the bit is readily deterministically cloned, something providing its well known technological value, whereas the qubit cannot be so cloned, providing it with its own unique uses.

The aspect of generalization involved in arriving at quantum information from earlier notions of information is then exposed: a source of quantum information is just a source of sequences of quantum states that, unlike classical physical states, have probability amplitudes that can be first added and then squared to provide physical probabilities, rather than only in being simply added or probabilistically weighted in mixtures of states. Timpson uses this characterization of quantum information, supplemented by a number of arguments, to argue convincingly that quantum information, like classical information when it is carefully and properly defined, is neither a concrete thing nor a sort of physical substance that can flow in space and time from source to destination. Indeed, much of the confusion regarding the nature of information already common in the case of classical information is due to the conflation of the common use of pairs of signal or storage states, often also called “bits” with the abstract bits of information communicated as defined by Shannon; once the two are conflated, it is a small step to considering information “flow” as having a spatiotemporal trajectory identical with that of the physical systems prepared and sent from the sender in a communications system to its receiver within that system. Matters easily become more confused when the subtleties of quantum mechanics are added, specifically, when one considers signal “qubits” and information communicated as measured in qubits of information.

Timpson next takes up the “quantum teleportation” protocol, which is important both conceptually and technologically. The “teleportation” of quantum states from one physical system to another can be straightforwardly demonstrated, although less easily so than in the case of the failure of the cloning of a quantum state from among a non-trivial set of quantum states. Nonetheless, this protocol has given rise to confusions related to the simplest one that, when quantum “teleportation” occurs, matter-energy is somehow transferred instantaneously across space, which would again lead one to seek out some (non-existent) continual spatiotemporal path from the source of information to the receiver of information. The connection of information with the interpretation of the quantum formalism is then made, by considering various analyses of this protocol. A more general case study is then taken up, that of work by Deutsch and Hayden (2000), which claims that greater insight into the nature of quantum information is obtained by viewing quantum information as physically localized. Timpson points out that the argument of these authors depends, among other things, in an essential way on an equivocal interpretation of the formalism they introduce and fails for that reason.

Timpson then turns to philosophical issues raised by quantum computing. He takes up the question of whether “quantum computational speedup” supports the view that quantum information must be understood as substantial. Because his position on this question has already been clearly established by this point in the book, which emphasizes the essentially abstract character of information throughout, this offers him the opportunity of demonstrating the particular advantages of his position in greater detail. Quantum speedup is any increase in efficiency of a quantum mechanical implementation of a computational algorithm, such as the Deutsch-Jozsa toy algorithm, using quantum mechanical states to perform searches or for the factoring of numbers, which is important in code-breaking applications, such as the Shor algorithm. It has been argued by others that the exponential efficiency offered in special circumstances by quantum computing algorithms, as in the case of the Shor factoring algorithm, requires that information be substantial in nature and, by some, that it can only be explained by the “many worlds” hypothesis. Timpson, of course, points out here that this cannot be correct. He then specifically considers the Church-Turing thesis in the quantum informational context as a possible constraint on what is physically possible in computation. In particular, although a physical principle known as the Turing principle can be seen to be true in quantum mechanics, the claim of Deutsch that this principle lies behind the Church-Turing thesis, is argued against. Timpson’s assessment is that this is due to an over-emphasis on the physical determinants of computation and, moreover, that the physical has been used to the extent the mathematical essence of computation is virtually excluded.

In book's last portion, Timpson addresses the foundations of quantum theory proper. It has been argued for nearly two decades now that quantum information theory will provide novel and deep insights into the foundations of physics. Moreover, an information-based physics could easily be seen as a continuation of the now centuries-long trend away from the view of physical systems as substantial in the most traditional sense. Such arguments have even been made by both advocates of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics and advocates of the apparently much different Everett interpretation, sometimes referred to as the “Many-worlds interpretation,” of the theory, both of which bear more affinity in their own ways to classical views of the world than to the more straightforward views of Dirac and von Neumann. Those advocating the second in the context of quantum computing have advocated either Everett relative-state interpretation itself or a more literal view of the universe as continually branching into an ever expanding multiplicity of subtly differing “universes.”

Timpson argues that, although quantum information theory has provided valuable and sophisticated tools that can aid in addressing foundational questions, these tools have strong limitations: one may succeed in providing an advanced instrumentalist picture but, due to the fact that one can’t have information regarding a proposition p without it being the case that p indeed holds, there is an inherent limitation to what it adds to the understanding of the quantum state itself.

Consistent with the book’s title, after having demonstrated the value of viewing information as abstract rather than substantial, in the final chapters Timpson takes up a number of novel attempts specifically to interpret quantum mechanics based on quantum informational notions. These include the approaches of Fuchs et al., Zeilinger et al., and of Clifton, Bub and Halvorson (Clifton et al. 2003), the last being the most thoroughgoing attempt to found an interpretation of quantum theory on an informational basis, namely, to provide information-centered axioms for quantum mechanics. Timpson’s assessments of these three approaches largely agree with the only previous detailed assessment of these programs (Jaeger 2009), namely, that they fall significantly short of their highest goals.

Timpson devotes two entire chapters to the interpretational approach of Fuchs et al., known as radical quantum Bayesianism. This approach is based on the thesis that all probabilities are to be understood as subjective probabilities. Timpson defends it first against the most commonly raised objections, namely, (i) that it is solipsistic, (ii) that it is instrumentalist and (iii) that it is inadequate for handling the sort of data appearing in scenarios of the type schematized in the example of Wigner’s friend. However, after showing that it is not so easily disregarded, unlike the approach, because it does not suffer from issues regarding the factivity of information and that it is easily formalized mathematically, Timpson explains the respects in which it is far less transparent with regard to fundamental philosophical issues. These issues are the question of the physical ontology with which it can be consistent, its ability to provide physical explanations, and the adequacy of the probabilities it provides under the interpretation given to probability under it. It is argued that, although one can make out the sort of ontology that might be given, difficulties are encountered in relation to providing adequate physical explanations, particularly in the context of composite quantum systems, that is, those systems exhibiting the most distinctly quantum mechanical characteristics, such as quantum entanglement. Moreover, it is argued that the subjective Bayesian character of its probabilities, which is its most distinguishing characteristic, commits it to a class of objectionable statements similar to those appearing in relation to Moore’s paradox.

Even the most sophisticated and detailed of the efforts to provide an informational interpretation of quantum mechanics, that of Clifton et al. (2003), although assessed by Timpson as having achieved its goal of providing an axiomatization of quantum theory, is shown to accomplish far less than the authors had hoped, due precisely to the choice of mathematical setting in which this is accomplished, namely, that of C* algebras. It is pointed out that these are now widely seen as insufficiently neutral as a starting point for their ambitious interpretational project of CBH. The central result is the CBH characterization theorem, a characterization of what they define as quantum theory in terms of three information-theoretical constraints, in the general setting of C* algebraic theory. These constraints are: no superluminal information transmission between two systems by measurements on just one; no information broadcasting; and no unconditionally secure bit-commitment. It is thought by its critics that the very assumption of the complex vector space by C* algebraic theory is too large an assumption for a fundamental axiomatization. Another issue is that there seem to exist theories that are clearly not quantum-theoretical in the typically understood sense, although CBH dispute their relevance. Timpson similarly argues that this work fundamentally fails to connect with the most significant interpretational issues with which it was designed to engage.

Timpson's is an important and highly informative work that touches on significant elements of the philosophical critique of quantum information theory. It also addresses the best-known novel information-focused proto-interpretations of quantum mechanics. The book very clearly treats its subject matter and carefully lays out its territory at each stage. It is recommended for both philosophers of science and physicists with a strong interest in quantum information theory or the foundations of quantum theory.


Clifton, R., Halvorson, H., and Bub, J., “Characterizing quantum theory in terms of information theoretic constraints,” Foundations of Physics 33, 1561-1591 (2003).

Deutsch, D., and Hayden, D., “Information flow in entangled quantum systems,” Proceedings of the Royal Society of London A 456, 1759-1774 (2000).

Jaeger, G., Quantum information, Springer 2006.

Jaeger, G., Entanglement, information, and the interpretation of quantum mechanics, Springer, 2009.

Plotnitksy, A., Epistemology and probability, Springer, 2010.

Rothstein, J., “Information, measurement, and quantum mechanics” Science 114, 171-175 (1951).