Questioning God, Indiana Series in the Philosophy of Religion

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Caputo, John D., Mark Dooley, and Michael J. Scanlon (eds.), Questioning God, Indiana Series in the Philosophy of Religion, Indiana University Press, 2001, 379pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0'253'21474'2.

Reviewed by Lisabeth During, Columbia University


In 1947 Adorno and Horkheimer complained that the expected resolution of the Enlightenment’s struggle with myth had not, strangely enough, arrived. Nature was disenchanted. But humans had found other ways of serving illusions. Religious mysteries survive, vestigial organs in the body of modern scientific rationality. For the Critical Theorists this backsliding amounted to bad faith, if not worse. Predicting an age when magic would obscure reason yet again, they saw in the idea of a revival of mysticism and religion too many reminders of fascism’s exaltations: “The paradoxical nature of faith ultimately degenerates into a swindle, and becomes the myth of the twentieth century; and its irrationality turns it into an instrument of rational administration by the wholly enlightened as they steer society toward barbarism.”1

For others, the contributors to the recent collection entitled Questioning God, the “return to religion” is not so alarming. An impressive roster of philosophers inspired by religion and theologians sensitive to modern directions in philosophy, including, as the star and touchstone, Jacques Derrida, take on the questions of the relation of theology to religion, of religion to morality, in a modern landscape in which a God may or may not be in eclipse. In the last two decades, Derrida has increasingly added an ethical preoccupation to the portrayal of that world without fixed signs. From his thoughts about forgiveness, responsibility and the ethical realm, to his notion of a “non-relation” as relation, Derrida sharpened important distinctions between the conditional and the unconditional, the gift and the exchange, which remind many in theology, if not of the early Karl Barth, of Kierkegaard and even Abraham. Traces of religious feeling and prophetic hope appear not only in his writings but in the equally demanding work of a variety of thinkers from Slavoj Zizek and Alain Badiou to Luce Irigaray, Jean-Luc Nancy and Jacques Lacan, not to mention philosophers of more traditional religious bent like Paul Ricoeur, Charles Taylor, and Hilary Putnam. Religion, it seems, is no longer taboo. The number of books in English willing to advertise a philosophic and cultural preoccupation with religion, if not orthodoxy, has been growing rapidly. Questioning God is not a surprising appearance in this context, but it is one of the best. While its occasion is the chance to stage an encounter between Derrida, philosophical theologians sympathetic to continental thought, and orthodox theologians rejecting such influences, its aims are less exclusive. Addressing two topics which the editors describe as “highly interactive” – God and forgiveness – the participants do not assume any predisposition for deconstruction, nor (with some exceptions) for religious belief. Within the individual papers as well as in the interplay between them, the concepts invoked are genuinely up for discussion; the field of a possible understanding is still wide open, porous and vulnerable, even the possession of faith, as Kevin Hart puts it, “never erases or suspends anxiety” (199).

Although “quite rightly passing for an atheist”,2 Derrida from the start has seemed to prepare new vistas for religious thinkers. His deconstructive efforts to increase the difficulty of language, rather than diminishing it, run in a strange parallel to the enigmatic discourse of negative theology, perhaps also to the Jewish tradition of infinite commentary. If he has attracted some, he has repelled others; some theologians in this collection, as in so many other places around the academic world, attack his influence as “nihilistic”, “aesthetic”, indeterminate to the point of despair. John Caputo, an editor of this collection, is one of the strongest voices resisting such denunciations. It is a matter, argues Caputo, of the kind of religious faith at issue. To his mind, the world in which we speak to God, and about God, is neither the world of knowledge nor of certainty: it is an uncertain world where anxiety is not overcome, and where decisions have no guarantee, where listening is sovereign over speculation, acknowledgement more important than understanding, and silence may be the last word. Yet this does not make it, he maintains, a world in principle closed to faith.

Perhaps the main point of invoking religious names in such a context is to register the traditions whose withdrawal has left behind such vivid incisions. Such a registration, itself not without anguish, may be one of the things deconstruction does, and does remarkably well. Jean-Luc Nancy finds that “deconstruction … is itself shot through with Christianity”, “the last gasp of tradition”.3 Between the God-besotted atheists of literary and philosophical modernism and those genuinely immune to religious temptations and ideas, the difference may be only that the former (like Derrida) cannot stop remembering. On the one hand there is a feeling of loss, which preserves a connection, however tenuous, to the tradition; on the other, a happy indifference to a promise never delivered. In the “postmodern condition” cited by the editors, religious attitudes often seem to float free of the context of faith, authority, and their institutions.4 Wittgenstein once remarked, “I am not a religious person, but I cannot help seeing every problem from a religious point of view”.5 Always amorphous, the terrain of the religious spreads in strange directions, and not a lot is left unclaimed. What are the minimum criteria for considering oneself in a relation to God? How can I, if I want to, prove myself immune to religiosity? The hardened atheist may be only the knight of faith in training. Is belief necessary?

At three recent conferences held by the Catholic Villanova University on the topic of ‘Religion and Postmodernism’, Derrida has been the center, and in many respects the rationale, of a series of conversations that follow Augustinian themes into unexpected directions. The conference in 1999, of which this volume is the record, addressed a problem which the organizers viewed as raised by Derrida’s recent work, but which they also note as having, for those with ears to hear, a biblical resonance impossible to ignore. This is the question of forgiveness: can there be such a thing as forgiveness? Is forgiveness speakable after Auschwitz? Who forgives and who is forgiven? Is forgiveness conditional? Does one have the right to forgive? Does God? It is easy to see why one would choose to begin a debate between theology and contemporary French philosophy just here. Derrida’s work in the last five years has thematized the issues of forgiveness, perjury, testimony and justice, and his proximity to the Jewish (if also God-denying) Emmanuel Levinas has come increasingly to the foreground. The second strand of the conference had the looser task of “questioning God”, a theme the editors claim is “highly interactive” with the topic of forgiveness. Here it is oddly the figure and texts of Augustine which help to introduce a welcome specificity and density to the discussions raised within the papers and between their authors.

This first part of the book, “On Forgiveness”, is the more sharply focused and timely. It begins with Derrida working through his recent arguments on the possibility and impossibility of forgiveness, on hyperbolic ethics and its demand for purity and unconditionality, and on the paradoxical economies involved in the gift, reconciliation, and forgetting. Though readers may know this work from other places,6 the version here is well worth pursuing for the bracing and sensitive attention Derrida brings to Vladimir Jankélévitch’s divergent understandings of the ethics of forgiveness in the context of the Holocaust. Out of this set of themes, continued in a high-powered roundtable that exposes many of the rifts further discussions will deepen, come strong papers by the Jewish thinker Robert Gibbs and the Anglo-Catholic theologian John Millbank, together with a persuasive riposte to Millbank by one of the editors, Mark Dooley.

If Part I moves between the religious and secular registers, Part II, still intimately attentive to Derrida, accepts as its own the classical problem of theology: how to speak of God. With these discussions, it proves more difficult to keep a unity of argument in view, as they range from the scrupulous wrestling with Heidegger and Augustine that informs Jean Griesch’s “Idipsum” to a rather miscellaneous and peripheral survey of the categories of “being, subjectivity and otherness” by Francis Schlüsser Fiorenza. Most engage in detailed and original ways with deconstruction and what the editors want to call “postmodernism”, and what the writers here offer represents a marked advance on the kind of response we would have found in comparable collections twenty or even ten years ago. As neither straightforward exegesis of Derrida’s ideas nor justification would seem to be demanded at this stage, the authors are free to build on their own sophisticated premises. While the voices of a poet-philosopher like Kevin Hart and a literary-religious scholar like Regina Schwartz are distinctively modern and in close contact with current critical debates, there is a medieval flavor to a conference on “Questioning God”, appropriate for an event under the auspices of an Augustinian University. Conjuring up names from Karl Barth to Aquinas and Moses, the papers in Part II ask questions that would not have surprised a scholastic: Can God’s selfhood be reconciled with his otherness? Is revelation at the far extreme from knowledge? What is the significance of the Virgin Mary for the understanding of God, Father, Son, and sacrifice?

As it turns out, the theology produced is in most respects far from traditional. Language is an important issue, as one might expect from modern philosophers.7 Participants wonder about what it is that we name when we name or fail to name God, whether there are left in modern life any “holy names”, as Hölderlin called them, whether these belong only to those within the fold of a confessional community or whether they sometimes gravitate towards those voluntarily exiled from such communities. In keeping with the recent continental philosophy that is the common legacy of most of the Villanova scholars, the question addressed to God is modified to include the question of the limits of metaphysics and the plenitude, or poverty, and even hollowness, of human speech. Tempted by what appears to be in so many places in Derrida a “religion without religion”, Caputo, Dooley, and Scanlon, professors from Villanova and Dublin, set their speakers the task of exploring, for the mutual interest of philosophy and theology, a discourse in which God may not appear but in which certain highly charged and quasi-transcendent reminders of his presence do. The tradition of negative theology, or other philosophical, literary and theological resources (prayer, praise, narrative, poetry), can help to sustain an address to the divine without running the risks of idolatry or anthropomorphism.

The third, and to my mind most contentious, strand of the discussion documented here, arises from an encounter the editors wished to encourage between the recent Protestant movement called “radical orthodoxy” and the philosophers, priests, and rabbis influenced by the thought of Derrida, Heidegger, Levinas, and Marion. If this was an opportunity worth pursuing, its results are disappointing. An unexpected Christocentrism, an assumption that all hearers and readers live, and presumably believe, “in the Christian West” (92), interferes with the understanding the “new orthodox” might have been able to bring to Derrida’s notions of ‘religion as interruption’, ‘hyperbolic ethics’ ‘différance’ and testimony. Gianni Vattimo, in another recent symposium of philosophers reflecting on the resurgence of religion, remarks, “It is often said that religious experience is an experience of leave-taking”.8 Secure in the foundations and truth of their faith, at least two of the theologians in this volume (Millbank and Ward) are unwilling to risk even a temporary exile from the enchanted circle of scripture, authority, and confession.

If deconstruction, as Caputo has passionately argued here and in a number of other places, involves abandonment, an Abrahamic risking of one’s community, one’s tradition and even one’s intellectual coherence, it may have little to offer those committed to the justification of the faith. To judge from the theological positions represented here by Millbank and Ward, any new moment of doubt or questioning that presents itself will still turn out to be anchored by the security of salvation which has been offered, and guaranteed, by the event of the Incarnation. As Dooley remarks of Millbank, “Forgiveness and reconciliation appear to be impossible not only for those of a secular or nihilistic mind but also for those of a non-Christian religious disposition.” (135) Perhaps the failure of understanding arises from the discrepancy between the Christian Incarnational tradition and the endlessly deferred promise of Judaism. Derrida, like Walter Benjamin, Theodor Adorno, Paul Celan, and I would guess, Emmanuel Levinas, is quite sure no one has been saved. Their messianism is the messianism of poignant deferral: the ‘Not-yet’ and the ‘Not-all’ of infinite striving which some non-Jews like Kant and Lessing preferred to the moment of arrival and embrace. And for this tradition, the bearer of this messianic promise is the human species, even if a humanity touched with the divine spirit of ethical obligation, not the God-man.

Yet the distinction between Christocentric and Jewish forms of messianism fails to explain what Caputo and Dooley argue is the radical-orthodox misrepresentation of Derrida’s thinking.9 Several of the most finely judged and satisfying papers in this collection speak from a standpoint of Christian belief: Jean Griesch’s on divine selfhood and Kevin Hart’s on “absolute interruption”, probably the best close reading of Derrida in the collection. John Caputo’s defense of deconstruction and critique of the new orthodoxy is passionately inspired by Derrida, but also by Christian theology. Regina Schwartz learns both from Jean-Luc Marion and Derrida, but finds literary or rhetorical resources different from theirs, ones that help her to preserve both the pain and the acknowledgment within the distance of human and divine. None of these thinkers abdicate their religious beliefs in favor of “nihilism”, “masochism” (Millbank, 65), the paralysis of the bad infinite, “onanism” (sic), “coitus interruptus” (Ward’s description of Derrida’s “questioning”), or “moving into deeper space in the starship Enterprise” (286). Why should one expect them to do so? With John Caputo I was baffled by the crudeness of the abuse aimed at Derrida and those inspired by him. If the tag ‘radical orthodoxy’ is meant to invite comparisons with the great Church Dogmatist Karl Barth, it has to be remembered that Barth never allowed his zest for polemic to be tainted by the slightest whiff of self-congratulation. I can think of better ways for his legacy to be continued.

Hent de Vries has written recently of Heidegger that

he was faced with the necessity of both respecting and violating the distinction that appears to demarcate the religious from the phenomenological, as well as the theological from the philosophical… . Both the Heidegger of the early lectures and Derrida in his most recent writings … seem to situate themselves in fact at once extremely close to and at an infinite remove from the phenomenon called “religious”.10

Some will find this proximity and distance uncomfortable. Heidegger quotes a fragment of Novalis: “Philosophy is really homesickness, an urge to be at home everywhere.”11 In the remark of Vattimo’s I quoted earlier, religious experience is described as an endless leave-taking. Leave-taking can be pleasurable, its flight not just an act of separation but a wish for the hospitality to come. Questioning God, in its very plurality of positions and the clarity of its conversations, offers a needed introduction to the charm of this ambiguous approaching and withdrawing. At once familiar and abandoned, the unfinished business of religion is located for philosophy in a relation best called uncanny, or, in Stanley Cavell’s sense, romantic. The questions presented by this book will be frustrating to those who think they have already worked out the form the relation between religion and philosophy should take (whether as rejection or subordination). But they are not its intended audience.


1. Dialectic of Enlightenment, trans. John Cumming, London: Verso, 1979, p.20.

2. See “30”, in Circonfession: cinquante-neuf périodes et périphrases, in Jacques Derrida, par Geoffrey Bennington et Jacques Derrida (Paris: Éditions du Seuil, 1991) p.146.

3. “The Deconstruction of Christianity”, in Hent de Vries and Samuel Weber, eds., Religion and Media (Stanford: Stanford UP, 2001) p.121-122.

4. Understandably, it is no longer philosophy’s role to serve as a handmaiden to faith, nor to bolster the claims of revelation with its arguments: theology in its “post-metaphysical dispensation” is likely to consider itself free from such needs, readier to bestow insights than to wait on them.

5. From Ludwig Wittgenstein: Personal Recollections, ed. Rush Rhees (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991), p.94; cited in Hilary Putnam’s Introduction (1999) to Understanding the Sick and the Healthy: A View of World, Man and God, by Franz Rosenzweig, trans. Nahum Glatzer (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard UP, 1999) p.19.

6. The most convenient is the recent mini-publication, On Cosmopolitanism and Forgiveness, trans. Mark Dooley and Michael Hughes (London: Routledge, 2001).

7. The connections between modern philosophy of language in Europe and Christian theology is finely drawn by Graham Ward in his excellent Barth, Derrida and the Language of Theology (Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1995), a sympathetic and informed treatment of Derrida (“Barth’s theology of the Word…his analogia fidei, his Christology and incarnational theology – are theological readings of a law of textuality, a law of performance and repetition described by Derrida as the economy of différance”, 9), and Levinas which makes his dismissive stance in this collection very puzzling (274-290). For greater consistency see Kevin Hart, The Trespass of the Sign, second edition (Cambridge: CUP, 2000), and this volume, 186-208.

8. Gianni Vattimo, “The Trace of the Trace”, trans. David Webb, in Religion, ed. Jacques Derrida and Gianni Vattimo (Stanford: Stanford UP, 1998), 79-94 (p.79).

9. It is curious that John Millbank’s earlier Theology and Social Theory: Beyond Secular Reason (Oxford: Blackwell, 1990), gets strong, if brief, approval from Hent De Vries, a central presence in the interpretation of religion via Heidegger, Derrida and Levinas, and the author of a book important for anyone interested (at a more advanced level) in the issues raised in Questioning God. See his Philosophy and the Turn to Religion (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins UP, 1999), p.2. De Vries does not think that Millbank is returning “to theology or religion per se”. I can’t see him as ever having been anywhere else.

10. De Vries, cited supra, p.227, 242.

11. Novalis, Fragment 21. Schriften, Vol. 2, ed. J. Minor (Jena, 1923), p.178, cited in Heidegger, The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, trans. William McNeill and Nicholas Walker (Bloomington: Indiana UP, 1995), p.5.