Radical History and the Politics of Art

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Gabriel Rockhill, Radical History and the Politics of Art, Columbia University Press, 2014, 274pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231152013.

Reviewed by Alison Ross, Monash University


In the closing pages of his ambitious new book, Gabriel Rockhill argues against the 'widespread consensus that the era of revolutionary politics and radical art -- if it ever truly existed -- is definitively behind us' (237). Rockhill maintains that the theoretical presuppositions of this 'end of illusions thesis' are shared by the standard, ontological approach to the topic of 'art and politics,' which attempts to specify their points of interrelation. Against the substantialist ontology that assumes that in the case of 'art' and 'politics' we are dealing with 'two separate entities', and then moves to articulate the features of art's form, content or effect that would relate it to or, in the case of the end of illusions thesis, sever it from 'politics', Rockhill puts forward a 'sociohistorical praxeology.' He describes this 'praxeology' as 'radical history'. His position pivots on the claim that aesthetic and political practices admit of 'multiple types and points of agency, with variable ranges and levels of determinacy' (238). The project he outlines, which shows that the modes of conceptualization attached to these practices matter, aims to 'change the very terms of the debate' regarding the politics of art (238). One sign of this change is evidently terminological: we would move away from empty discussions of 'the politics of art', to a new problematic that would consist in the study of the 'aesthetic politicity' of practices. The shift would not be merely terminological. It would signal the end of the ontological chimeras that allow either scepticism regarding art's political significance or theses that delimit this significance to particular styles or techniques to thrive. Thus Rockhill's book is a polemic against the various theoretical presuppositions and postures, which fatally misconstrue the relevant factors for assessing the actual agency of aesthetic practices. It is also an assertive defence of the 'politicity' of these practices.

In an early chapter, Rockhill chides Alain Badiou for acting as if positions could be accomplished by philosophical fiat (24). The ambitions of this work raise a similar problem: will the habitual ways of conceiving of the 'politics of art' cease on Rockhill's say so? Can his arguments successfully re-set the course of established debates? Presumably this is the wrong objection to make: the shift he envisages would bring theoretical debates about the arts in line with what is happening on the ground. In its focus on the depth field of historical practices the book takes its inspiration from certain aspects of Michel Foucault's approach to history. In its defence of the idea that art and aesthetics have radical political significance, its sympathies lie with Jacques Rancière's attempts to highlight the revolutionary significance of aesthetic experience. The book's tone, however, is more stridently polemical than one would ordinarily associate with either of these thinkers. This can be seen above all in the uses to which their ideas are put.

The book has four main parts: 'Historical Encounters between Art and Politics'; 'Visions of the Avant-Garde'; 'The Politics of Aesthetics'; and 'The Social Politicity of Aesthetic Practices'. Each part consists of two chapters. The first chapter defends Rockhill's 'radical historicist' approach to aesthetic and political practices. It specifies the differences between such historicism and what he calls respectively 'selective' and 'reductive' versions of historicism. These versions are inadequate conceptualisations of the 'sheer flow of time' that, on Rockhill's view, defines history. He likens this sheer flow of time to a 'universal acid' that dissolves the supposed stability of cherished categories (37). Selective history 'postulates the existence of a fixed kernel behind historical change' (36). It is selective because it exempts this kernel from change. The reductive version ties historical development to specifiable historical determinants (36). According to Rockhill, 'all of our practices . . . are fundamentally historical, but . . . this does not mean that they are somehow reducible to a unique set of historical determinants' (36-37). In contrast to such a view, he explains his radical historicism with reference to Foucault's preference for an 'analytic' of how power operates rather than a 'theory' of what power is (37): the idea, transposed to Rockhill's project, is that there is no art or politics in general but 'immanent practices that are qualified as "artistic" or "political" in variable sociohistorical conjunctures' (37).

The second chapter deals with three different twentieth century conceptions of the relation between art and politics. Lukác's 'realism', Marcuse's 'formalism' and Sartre's 'commitment' are each presented as deficient attempts at an ontological approach to art that try to specify the appropriate conditions for its authentic connection to politics. Of course, any selection of figures from the twentieth century as somehow representative of the 'standard' thinking on 'art and politics' would be vulnerable to the charge of arbitrariness. Rockhill notes the objection, but quickly moves on (56). Still, the selection of these figures is telling: Rockhill's dispute seems to be with twentieth century articulations of the art/politics dyad, thus excluding the diverse ontologies of the arts, like Heidegger's or Nancy's, that do not reference it explicitly. Similarly, the focus on this dyad means that it is the Marxist conceptions of art that occupy his attention. One of the chapter's key issues is the binary assumption that certain artistic techniques or intentions secure a 'good' politics, whereas others cannot. Rockhill's selection of authors who identify mutually incompatible versions of this pathway to 'good' political art shows the difficulties of any such approach: when the thesis is confidently attached to styles of art that, on another account of the same techniques, exclude it, it looks very frail indeed. On the other hand, Rockhill's attention to the complex weave of factors that sit beyond the hold of an artist's political intentions, or the virtues of particular techniques, intensifies the problem of whether this discussion, which aims to re-establish the political significance of art, need have any connection to the field of the 'arts'. After all, one effect of Rockhill's discussion seems to be the demolition of the semantic cogency of 'art' in favour of 'aesthetics'. This is implied by his understanding of the dissolvability of cherished categories within the 'acidic' flow of historical time; 'aesthetics' is tenable where 'art' is not, precisely because it admits of a more malleable range of reference points and especially because it signals a 'practice' rather than a 'concept'.

The next two chapters are on the avant-garde. Rockhill looks at the connections between Peter Bürger's position on 'the historical avant-garde' and the thesis that the political promise of art was an illusion. Rockhill takes issue with the triumphant fatalism that surrounds the description of the avant-garde as past, i.e., 'historical', and he identifies the 'abandonment of aesthetics and the retreat of radicalism' in third-generation critical theory as evidence of the pernicious hold of the end of illusions thesis (94). He singles out in recent Frankfurt School theorists the absence of the type of 'interdisciplinary' work that had characterised the writing of Benjamin and Adorno on aesthetic topics as especially telling indications of this altered focus. He argues that the end of illusions thesis advances an 'epistemological and historiographical' utopia in which its 'absolute knowledge concerning what is historically possible' puts an end 'to all other utopian aspirations and practices' (93).

In the fourth chapter, Rockhill embarks on a reconsideration of avant-garde practices in accordance with his alternative logic of history: primarily, this involves setting aside the model of history as a 'singular process of development' in order to take into account 'the vertical dimension of chronology, the horizontal dimension of geography, and the stratigraphic dimension of social practices' (118). A clearer view of avant-garde practices than Bürger's requires that we understand the 'avant garde' 'as a concept in struggle, a sociohistorical notion immanent to a certain number of specific practices' (124).

Part III, on the politics of aesthetics, contains two chapters on Jacques Rancière's aesthetics. The first establishes the features of Rancière's thinking on aesthetic questions with economy and clarity. The second looks at some of the difficulties in Rancière's position. These chapters are the strongest in the book. This is because the first two parts dealing with historical encounters and the avant-garde seem to go over old territory (e.g., Bürger's theory of the avant-garde and Sartre's politics of commitment), and also tend to repeat the claims made in the Introduction and first chapter regarding the 'immanent' status of practices. It is sometimes difficult to see the contemporary currency of these interlocutors, although features of their positions are parsed in general terms as 'the standard view' (52). These positions will no doubt seem to some readers less standard than dated.

The chapters on Rancière, in contrast, deal with writing that takes a fresh perspective on the issues at the heart of Rockhill's project. They also showcase Rockhill's deft capacity to identify problems in a paradigm close to the one he argues for. As such, these chapters provide the occasion for the most robust defence of the book's overall position. Furthermore, Rancière's position can rightly claim a greater contemporary interest than some of the other positions that Rockhill treats in detail. Indeed key aspects of Rancière's approach, such as his rejection of the explanatory adequacy of guiding concepts in art history, like the supposedly 'anti-mimetic' impetus and trajectory of 'modernism', are now finding a receptive audience amongst many contemporary artists. Rancière uses a vocabulary of 'regimes' to capture the diverse elements at play in art practices. These are different ways of formulating the logic and nature of artistic representation as well as of the perception of particular instances of sensuous forms, words or sounds as art; they are explicitly pitted against the shortcomings of traditional art historical categories. Amongst the different regimes Rancière describes are the 'representative' and the 'aesthetic'. The former is a regime that locates aesthetic significance in verbal articulation and the narrative structure of a story, whereas the latter is defined by its democratic extension of the premise of aesthetic meaningfulness to anything at all, including silent, sensuous forms. Eschewing the category of the 'modern', Rancière claims that 'diverse elements from the representative and aesthetic regimes of art' can be found across the age of democratic revolutions (i.e., the framework of the social revolutions of the nineteenth and twentieth centuries) and that these elements, in Rockhill's words, 'function independently of chronological sequences such as classicism and modernism' (150). Rancière articulates these regimes in terms of their constitutive interrelation with aspects of democratic revolutions.

Rockhill gives an impressive overview of the components of this position and its range. He also shows its points of connection to the writings of Deleuze and Foucault (158ff). One topic of particular significance for Rockhill's position is Rancière's argument that aspects of the modernist thesis on the arts have a philosophical version in what he terms 'modernatism', the idea that aspects of the aesthetic regime of art have been understood as 'the concrete manifestation of the modern destiny of humanity' (151). Versions of this idea can be found in Schiller's notion of the 'aesthetic state', the authors of the 'Oldest System-Program of German Idealism,' and Heidegger's criticisms of the modern forgetting of the question of being. These chapters give us a fuller sense of the stakes of Rockhill's position, especially since Rancière outlines what Rockhill describes as 'a topography of autonomous axioms of perception, which only exist in the combinatory forms attested to by concrete historical formations' (162).

In the light of this discussion, Rockhill's treatment of 'standard' twentieth century views finds the contrasting position it needs to highlight the limitations of ontological conceptions of art. Above all, the engagement with Rancière emphatically marks the transition in the book from the vocabulary of 'art' to 'aesthetics'. The former has the status of a node that names mutually incompatible ideas of art (anti-mimeticism, realism, formalism, commitment), whereas the latter has the meaning of 'practices' whose contours and interactions may be identified and described in their complex variability as axioms of perception and patterns of sensuous experience of the meaningfulness of form. Rockhill takes issue, unsurprisingly, with Rancière's insistence on the separation of art and politics. His criticisms of Rancière on this point are important because they show that this idea of separation is not solely the territory of the ends of illusions thesis, for the latter thesis is also an object of Rancière's polemical attention. Although Rockhill's contestation of Rancière on this point is entirely consistent with the thesis of the book, I think that it highlights some of the problems with Rockhill's position. I will discuss these briefly below.

Part IV, on the social politicity of aesthetic practices, consists in a case study of the political interests that coalesced around art practices in North America, especially abstract art, during the cold war, as well as a chapter that gives an expanded treatment of Rockhill's claims regarding what he refers to as 'the talisman complex' and the 'ontological illusion'. The chapter on the cold war is a practical exemplification of the book's thesis. It peels back the competing interests and agendas that shaped but did not fully determine certain modes of supposedly 'apolitical' artistic production and reception. In this chapter we can see the unintended consequences that unfold from attempts to strategise cultural artefacts and the institutional and sub-institutional layers at play in how art is produced, distributed and received. The socio-historical network in which art exists and participates makes it difficult, Rockhill shows, to talk in any meaningful sense about an artwork having a mono-causal relation to 'effects'. The last chapter is a more developed analysis of material introduced in Part I. Rockhill states that his book needs to be read as 'a palimpsest with multiple entrance points and various levels and objects of analysis' (235). When it comes on the back of his detailed case study of the politics of the cold war, the effectiveness of Rockhill's critique of the conception of art as if it were some type of magic talisman is more in evidence.

Some of the most interesting problems this book raises are those of definition and terminology. This can be seen in Rockhill's insistent call for attention to the 'immanent' field of practices, which organises the way he defines 'art' and 'politics'. He opposes 'immanence' to 'transcendence' and claims, as I noted above, that Badiou's axioms are impotent because they stand outside the field of praxis that they claim to order. In contrast, Rockhill's manner of grappling with concepts from within their historical field of play is able to re-course this field, on his account, precisely because it does not stand outside it. Within the 'immanent' field of practices there are no solid categories; these belong to the 'transcendent', legislative world of 'external' axioms. The passing, critical reference to Badiou thus holds the weight of many of Rockhill's claims. We can cite in this respect the contrast between the treatment of Badiou and the terms he uses to defend Rancière's axiom of equality: 'The supposed transcendental value of equality and democratic literarity is in fact immanent in a particular historical struggle' (161).

The way Rockhill phrases his discussion occasionally seems to run counter to the main point of the study. Just as he objects to the binary normativity applied to art when certain features are selected as evidence of its political significance, so too 'immanence' seems to be synonymous with 'good' and 'transcendent' with 'bad' forms of analysis. However, the type of polemical attention he gives to so-called 'transcendent' concepts does not in virtue of this terminology manage to hold them 'outside' the contested, and valued, 'complex' field of historical practices, nor negate their capacity to shape the latter. In this sense the terminology has less purchase than its pervasive use assumes. For instance, he excoriates the vocabulary of autonomous art as a key example of a substantialist theory of art. This may be true. But it is also true that aesthetic autonomy is an idea that in its different formulations has historically been tied to the heteronomous field of non-art (e.g., Kant's use of the doctrine to support his practical philosophy, or Adorno's attempts to use it to criticise commodification). In this respect the idea of autonomy is not just about the separate features of art, but how these qualify art as a platform of connection to other fields. Further, as Kant could be cited to show, the doctrine of aesthetic autonomy is not reducible to the field of the fine arts, in part because it concerns the autonomy of a judging subject. The various uses to which this doctrine is put seem to allow us to defend this concept in terms that are similar to the ones Rockhill uses to defend Rancière's axiom of equality. The term, in short, is contested and contestable in the various contexts of its use and it does not therefore constitute a particular ontology of art, unless we disregard the history of its use. How can Rockhill's neologism of 'aesthetic politicity', which is without any history, claim an advantage here?

Similarly, the dependence on the opposition of the 'immanent' to the 'transcendent' cannot always locate conceptual debate in the latter camp. In this respect Rockhill's very insistence on the connection between 'art and politics' might be seen as a type of selective history in the pejorative sense he gives to this term. His rejection of Rancière's position on this topic is telling. Rancière points out that it was Marxists (Greenberg, Adorno, etc.) who prosecuted the case for the autonomous purity of the arts, and he conjectures that their interest in the concept may be understood as an attempt to secure revolutionary significance somewhere other than the social field in which their 'real revolution' had failed.[1] He complains, too, that the nuances of this type of position get flattened out in the later formulations of the 'doctrine' of aesthetic autonomy. There is a knot that is formed from the expectations that have historically been attached to the conceptual defence of art's political significance. This knot forms the other side to the story that Rockhill tells. It requires critical attention not because intellectual projects need to be even-handed, but because they need to take into account pertinent features of the field of their intervention. I make this point despite my general sympathy for approaches like Rockhill's that are sceptical of the legislative pretensions of philosophical concepts. Sometimes the study of ideas and their conceptual histories do matter, because they are not just 'ideas' but 'practices'.

Rockhill's study does not so much demolish the terms of the 'standard' debate on 'art' and 'politics', as provide eloquent elucidation of the following proposition: there has never been a standard position on 'art' and 'politics.' The diverse ecology that goes by these labels is remarkable precisely for the absence of any agreement on what these terms might mean and to which specific practices they might refer. In this sense, Rockhill's book is important because it gives exemplary attention to the factors that a competent approach to this area needs to consider. More than this, Rockhill shows that obscurity is the appropriate fate for undisciplined conceptual speculation, even if such speculation can sometimes qualify as a type of practice.

[1] See on this topic, Jacques Rancière, 'The Aesthetic Revolution and its Outcomes: Emplotments of Autonomy and Heteronomy', New Left Review 14 (March/April, 2002): 133-51; and Jacques Rancière interviewed by Peter Hallward, 'Politics and Aesthetics: An Interview', Angelaki Vol. 8, No. 2, 2003: 191-211.