Radical Indecision: Barthes, Blanchot, Derrida, and the Future of Criticism

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Leslie Hill, Radical Indecision: Barthes, Blanchot, Derrida, and the Future of Criticism, U. of Notre Dame Press, 2010, 438pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268031077.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame



As a rule literary criticism is not a thing of any philosophical interest, at least not in English-speaking contexts. It is true that occasionally philosophers in the analytic tradition have written about literature, but only under the pretext of doing moral philosophy, meanwhile adhering faithfully to Aristotle’s principle that literature means narrative conceived as a form of cognition (mimesis) and rational deliberation (plot). Lexis, sometimes translated as “diction,” is not part of the definition of literature. Donald Davidson once broke ranks by writing about James Joyce’s Finnegans Wake, arguing that one can learn to read the Wake, despite its Babel-like confusion of tongues, much the way an anthropologist can get the hang of the discursive practices of an alien culture.1 Davidson’s assumption that the language of Finnegans Wake is still chiefly a form of mediation leaves much unsaid, but his pragmatic approach to what is singular and irreducible in linguistic experience could just as well be applied to any refractory modernist artwork (one of Duchamp’s Readymades, for example), where the idea is not so much to understand something as it is to respond to the kind of aporia that T. W. Adorno describes in his Aesthetic Theory:

The better an artwork is understood, the more it is unpuzzled on one level, the more obscure its constitutive enigmaticalness [konstitutiv Rätselhaftes] becomes. It [the Rätselcharakter of the work] only emerges demonstratively in the profoundest experience of art. If a work opens itself completely, it reveals itself as a question and demands reflection; then the work vanishes into the distance, only to return to those who thought they understood it, overwhelming them for a second time with the question, “What is it?”2

Leslie Hill is a literary critic, not a philosopher, but as a Professor of French Studies at Warwick University in England he is situated at an interesting, if possibly fatal, crossroads: on the one side is a venerable British tradition that thinks of criticism in terms of the elucidation and evaluation — which is to say the elevation — of literary monuments (F. R. Leavis); on the other there is recent French intellectual culture, where the boundaries between philosophy and literature are often indeterminate, meaning particularly that the writing of both philosophy and criticism is nothing if not “modernist” in its embrace of nondiscursive forms of language, a practice reflected in Hill’s own elliptical prose, with its recurrent play of chiasmus and oxymoron (“the readability of any text is made both possible and impossible only by the impenetrable shadow of the unreadable” 336). One recalls Jürgen Habermas’s objection to the way Derrida and his American followers in literary studies leveled “the genre distinction between philosophy and literature,” and his argument that the task of criticism is to translate “the experiential content of the work of art into normal [i.e. communicative] language.”3 Hill will have none of Habermas. His book consists of three extensive monographs on Roland Barthes, Maurice Blanchot, and Jacques Derrida, and, although he nowhere refers to Adorno, his aim is to show how their engagement with literature converts what we think of as criticism into something like the aporetic experience (what Hill calls “radical indecision”) that occupies such a definitive place in Adorno’s aesthetics. This conversion is not just a break with the past; it opens criticism to a time that, as Derrida would say, is “still to come,” a time marked by interruption, reserve, and interminability. One thinks of John Cage’s line that defined the impasse that avant-garde or experimental art spent the better part of the last century expanding in multiple directions: “I have nothing to say, and I am saying it.”4 The work of art is no longer an object to be housed in a museum or repertoire; it is an event to be lived through as a kind of limit-experience in which we confront, in Maurice Blanchot’s elusive conception, “a meaning for the meaning of words that, while determining that meaning, also surrounds this determination with an ambiguous indeterminacy that wavers between yes and no.”5

Hill’s chapter on Barthes traces Barthes’ career as a critic from Le Degré zero de l’écriture (1953), with its rejection of signification as “the mythical ‘alibi’” of literature, to the later fragmentary writings like Le Plaisir du texte (1973), with its idea that a literary text is not for reading but is an ecstatic event that disrupts the conventions of construction and consumption in which writers and readers usually transact their business. As Barthes argued in one of his last lectures, even a monumental text like Proust’s A la recherche du temps perdue should be approached not as a finished piece of work but as an open form that remains to be put into play by the reader. In this respect, Hill says, criticism for Barthes

had little to do with bringing the text before a tribunal of meaning, significance, or value; it corresponded instead, while adding nothing and taking nothing away, to provide the text with a unique performative shadow, simultaneously internal and external to it, and reaffirm it therefore not as the finite, complete, past entity that it was, but as the infinite, incomplete, futural prospect it now became. (145)

The literary work is not fixed or settled but an event that is always to come, and the task of criticism is to keep this future (more accurately, these multiple futures) always on the horizon, thus rescuing the literary work from the lockstep of critical methods one is required to adopt in the seminar room.

The chapter on Blanchot focuses principally on Blanchot’s early readings of the Marquis de Sade and his later texts on Marguerite Duras and Paul Celan. Hill’s pages on Blanchot’s Celan essay, “Le dernier à parler” (1984), are much the most interesting, because Blanchot does not give us a “reading” of Celan but instead assembles a series of citations from Celan’s poetry and prose, to which he adds very spare, interlinear remarks whose point is a refusal to bring things to a point. Hill writes:

What occurs, is given voice, or speaks, in ‘Le Dernier à parler,’ in this place without place of the commentator’s absence from himself, is not a reader’s critical assessment of Celan’s poetic achievement but rather Celan’s poetry itself, not as funereal monument, but infinite inscription — cited, recited, underwritten, overwritten, and translated at length, in its exteriority and dispersion, its readability and unreadability, its clarity and secrecy, its articulation and fragmentation. (196)

Still, it is not quite the case the Blanchot makes nothing of his Celan citations. Citation is always a form of appropriation, however reserved or discreet. The form of “Le dernier à parler,” for example, is that of a collage of found texts and marginalia in which one cannot help noticing the recurrence of Blanchot’s signature concept of Dehors: the Outside, the Neuter, the entretemps or temporality of the singular in which the rule of identity (or, indeed, of any logical or semantic closure) is without force.6 But of course Hill would reply that my saying this only means that I have made myself “the last to speak,” even while I am reminded of an early essay by Emmanuel Levinas, “La réalité et son ombre” (1948), whose theme is in part the aesthetic peculiarity of the entretemps:

Art brings about just this duration in the interval, in that sphere which a being is able to traverse, but in which its shadow is immobilized. The eternal duration of the interval in which a statue is immobilized differs radically from the eternity of a concept; it is the meanwhile [entretemps], never finished, still enduring — something inhuman and monstrous.7

To which Levinas adds, as if forecasting Habermas, that the task of criticism is to integrate “the inhuman work of the artist into the human world” (ibid, p. 12). On certain days I’m drawn to Walter Benjamin’s idea that “a criticism consisting entirely of quotations should be developed.”8

In his text on Mallarmé, “Le double séance” (1970), Derrida challenged (as does Hill after him)

the very possibility of a thematic criticism, seen as an example of modern criticism, at work wherever one tries to determine a meaning through a text, to pronounce a decision upon it, to decide that this or that is a meaning and that it is meaningful, to say that this meaning is posed, posable, or transposable as such: a theme.9

Hill’s chapter on Derrida is certainly the work of an expert — he is the author of the handy Cambridge Introduction to Jacques Derrida (2007) — but on my reading he seems rather more concerned with Derrida’s themes (dissemination, undecidability, the singularity of the signature) than with the formal innovations of Derrida’s work, particularly in the case of Glas, which Hill seems determined to defend against those who one might think of it, with its exploitation of the physical properties of the printed book, as a modernist artwork. (In a footnote Hill brushes aside Geoffrey Hartman’s great study of Glas, which is a model of descriptive as against exegetical-evaluative criticism.)10 This is not to gainsay Hill’s fine pages on Derrida’s Genet-interpretation (“Coward, traitor, thief, and queer”), which among other things is figured as a counterstatement to Sartre’s bloated Saint Genet. And Hill certainly has an ear for the ludic complexities of Derrida’s wordplay, as in his discussion of gl as a kind of endlessly reverberating sound poem, the acoustical materialization of “radical indecision”:

As such, insofar as it can be determined as a recognizable unit at all, and in so far as its movement was a swaying to and fro, [gl] performed a double movement in one: it was simultaneously a gurgling and a gargling, a gagging and a glugging, a clogging and a clearing, a clenching and an unclenching, a rocking to and fro from constriction to release and back again. (297)

But Hill’s achievement, it seems to me, is to reveal the close conceptual interaction among his three “critics,” although it would perhaps be more accurate to speak of a conceptual interaction with Maurice Blanchot, whose reflections on the infinite reserve or discretion of the Neuter underwrite Barthes and Derrida in crucial ways, meanwhile providing the regulating idea of Hill’s book, as he himself says in his preface: “It is not surprising…that the work of three of the most acutely inventive writers on literature in French or in any other language in the second half of the twentieth century…should be in the form of a lengthy engagement with the demand and necessity of indecision, as announced by such names as the neuter, the neutral, or the undecidable” (xiii-xiv).

However, as Hill insists, indecision is not indecisiveness but responsibility to the alterity of the particular text. For someone of my age his project recalls Northrop Frye’s argument in the Anatomy of Criticism (1957) that criticism should consist in the comparative and contrastive analyses of literary texts, not in evaluative judgments: philological attention to the details of the text against a background of historical research whose horizon extends from Homer to the most refractory experiments in recent European and North American poetry — this is what the once and future practice of criticism comes down to, and one cannot imagine that this philological/historical principle does not have a place in most humanistic disciplines, including philosophy.

The major question that Hill’s book raises is: How should criticism be written? On a charitable view, Hill’s baroque prose is an attempt to break free from what the American poet Charles Bernstein has called the “frame lock” or “tone jam” of current literary study, where everything that is published has the same monotonous drone of the doctoral thesis, the conference paper, and the latest issue of PMLA.11 The reduction of the other to the same is the rule of scholasticism. Of course, this same question of how to write was raised in European philosophy by Heidegger, and even more dramatically by Levinas, Foucault, Deleuze and Guattari, and of course most infamously by Derrida himself. Meanwhile in English-speaking contexts the idiosyncrasy of Stanley Cavell’s prose comes to mind, not to mention that of Cavell’s alter ego, Ludwig Wittgenstein. The difficulty is that, as every experimental artist knows, the most interesting efforts are apt to end in failure. It is doubtful that Hill’s book will have many readers among philosophers, and even Hill’s many admirers will find themselves under a heavy assignment. No doubt an important work, but as Samuel Johnson said of Milton’s Paradise Lost, “No one wished it longer.”

1 “James Joyce and Humpty Dumpty,” Philosophy and the Arts, ed. Peter French, et al. Midwest Studies in Philosophy, no. 16 (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1991), pp. 1-12

2 Trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), p. 121.

3 The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity: Twelve Lectures, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1990), p. 208.

4 “Composition as Process” (1958), Silence: Lectures & Writings by John Cage (Middletown CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1961), p. 51. Compare Blanchot in his introduction to Faux pas (1943): “The writer finds himself in the increasingly ludicrous condition of having nothing to write, of having no means with which to write it, and of being constrained by the utter necessity of always writing it.” Trans. Charlotte Mandel (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2001), p. 3.

5 Maurice Blanchot, “Literature and the Right to Death,” trans. Lydia Davis, The Work of Fire (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995), p. 343.

6 See, for example, the extended ruminations on le Neutre in Blanchot’s Le pas au-delà (1973), trans. as The Step Not Beyond by Lycette Nelson (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992), esp. pp. 72-86.

7 “Reality and Its Shadow,” Collected Philosophical Papers, trans. Alphonso Lingis (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1987), p. 11.

8 “Program for Literary Criticism” (1929), Selected Writings, II: 1927-1934, trans. Rodney Livingston, et al. (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 290.

9 “The Double Session,” Dissemination, trans. Barbara Johnson (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1981), p. 245.

10 Geoffrey Hartman, Saving the Text: Literature/Derrida/Philosophy (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1981). Hartman regards Glas as “an artform in itself,” one whose genealogy includes “Apollinaire’s ‘idèogrammes lyriques,’ Duchamp’s Readymades, the beginnings of concrete poetry in Marinetti, Kurt Schwitters, Paul Klee and others” (p. 35).

11 “Frame Lock,” My Way: Speeches and Poems (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1999), pp. 90-99.