Radical Skepticism and Epistemic Intuition

Bergmann Skepticism

Michael Bergmann, Radical Skepticism and Epistemic Intuition, Oxford University Press, 2021, 282pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192898487.

Reviewed by Charles Goldhaber, Haverford College


Zeno reasoned that motion is impossible. But it is not. Because we know that motion is possible, we see that something must be wrong with Zeno’s reasoning, even if we have not yet determined what. Reid claimed that the same is true of the skeptical arguments he found in Hume. He said:

Zeno endeavoured to demonstrate the impossibility of motion; [. . .] and this author [Hume], that no credit is to be given to our senses, to our memory, or even to demonstration. Such philosophy is justly ridiculous, even to those who cannot detect the fallacy of it. An Inquiry into the Human Mind, Ch. 1, §5        

In calling such philosophy “justly ridiculous,” Reid evidently thought that many of us had good grounds for rejecting it: “A traveller of good judgment may mistake his way, and be unawares led into a wrong track; [. . .] but when it ends in a coalpit, it requires no great judgment to know that he hath gone wrong, nor perhaps to find out what misled him” (IHM 1.8). Any reasoning which leads to the “coalpit” of skepticism could be known to be misleading in virtue of its conflicting with particular cases of perceptual, recollective, and demonstrative knowledge. We can find a similar attitude in Moore, who rejected the skeptic’s principles on the grounds of his greater confidence that here is a hand, there is a tree, and so on. Despite familiar criticisms, this attitude is compelling; rejecting claims we find to be inconsistent with what we know or justifiably believe seems to be at the very core of rationality.

Michael Bergmann’s Radical Skepticism and Epistemic Intuition develops a “Reidian-style response to radical skepticism” along these lines (1; cf. 4–5, 112–16, 122–23). Like Reid and Moore, Bergmann rejects skepticism in virtue of its conflicting with particular things we take ourselves to know or justifiably believe. But unlike his predecessors, Bergmann’s response to skepticism “explicitly and consciously relies on epistemic intuitions,” or “seemings about epistemic value or goodness,” such as a belief’s justification, rationality, or status as knowledge (4; cf. 123). Not only do our particular beliefs conflict with skeptical principles, but those beliefs are reinforced by our intuitions about their epistemic goodness—by its seeming to us that they are justified or constitute knowledge. For Bergmann, such seemings provide “evidence” for those beliefs (123). And we can appeal to this evidence to resist the skeptic’s arguments, even before determining how exactly they go wrong. Bergmann calls this response to skepticism “intuitionist particularist anti-skepticism.” It is “intuitionist” insofar as it exploits intuitions about the epistemic statuses of our beliefs. And it is “particularist” insofar as, at least at the start of inquiry, those intuitions concern only particular instances of perceptual, recollective, introspective, and a priori beliefs, rather than general epistemic principles.

Bergmann’s focus on epistemic intuitions is an innovation. It promises to make explicit and defend an underappreciated feature of historical commonsense anti-skepticism, like that of Reid and Moore (1n1). If it succeeds, it may also shed light on more recent attempts, such as the dogmatism advanced by Jim Pryor or disjunctivism by John McDowell. Bergmann’s focus on epistemic intuitions also leads to interesting discussions of epistemic circularity (Ch. 9 and 222–26) and of the relationship between skeptical dialectic and other topics in epistemology, including internalism and externalism (159–170) and peer disagreement (Ch. 12). Ultimately, however, I find that Bergmann’s appeal to epistemic intuitions exacerbates, rather than addresses, the main concerns about commonsense replies to skepticism. And, in a perhaps surprising twist, I find Bergmann’s proposal to itself be strikingly skeptical. I will briefly outline the book and then argue for these claims.

One of the book’s strengths is its revealing the general applicability of a form of skeptical argumentation typically waged against perceptual knowledge. Accordingly, Part I of the book motivates parallel skeptical arguments targeting many different classes of propositions. The basic move is to note that “we have an ‘evidence–truth gap’ problem for each of our [. . .] core faculties” (107), including perception (Ch. 2), memory (Ch. 4), introspection, a priori intuition, and reasoning (Ch. 5). In each case, this “evidence–truth gap” seems to imply skepticism about the relevant class of propositions, given that, as Bergmann argues in Ch. 3, the gap cannot be bridged by any form of argumentation. Much of the work in Chs. 2, 4, and 5, then, is devoted to arguing that all our core faculties really are subject to an “evidence–truth gap.” In particular, Bergmann argues that each core faculty produces at best “seemings” and, accordingly, evidence whose availability does not imply the truth of what seems to be so (22–26, 75–77, 85–90, 94–103, 104–106).

Part II introduces intuitionist particularist anti-skepticism (Ch. 6), clarifies and defends it from basic concerns (Ch. 7), and uses it to undermine the skeptical arguments from Part I (Ch. 8). Bergmann then considers and responds to two major concerns for intuitionist particularism—namely, that it leads to a vicious form of epistemic circularity (Ch. 9) and that it allows ridiculous and irresponsible beliefs to be rational (Ch. 10). Part III continues the defense of intuitionist particularism by confronting concerns about the normative status of epistemic intuitions. The first of these, mirroring the skepticism in Part I, exposes an “evidence–truth gap” for epistemic intuitions themselves (Ch. 11). The others concern findings from the peer disagreement literature (Ch. 12) and experimental philosophy (Ch. 13) that appear to undermine the evidence of our epistemic intuitions. I will confine my comments to Bergmann’s response to skepticism and his underlying methodology.

A good way to broach this topic is to note that common sense replies to skepticism have been criticized for stopping short of a diagnosis of skepticism. Moore’s claim to be more confident that “here is a hand” than in the skeptic’s principles, for instance, does not by itself tell us which of the skeptic’s principles should be rejected and why. And so it seems to leave us in the dark about the real source of skepticism and so of how it might be resisted. Bergmann seems at times to be aware of this worry (though see 200n18, 259). For example, in an interesting discussion of Susanna Rinard’s recent work (65–72), he notes that finding skepticism to be self-undermining still leaves skeptical arguments intact, and seemingly just as persuasive (70). Can the intuitionist particularist diagnose where the skeptic goes awry?

The key premise in the skeptical arguments which Bergmann resists in Ch. 8 is the claim that a belief can be justified by evidence which does not imply its truth, only if it is supplemented with an argument which bridges the evidence–truth gap (see “UP,” or Premise 1 in the arguments on 29, 78, 91, and 151). Bergmann rejects this premise and accepts its negation—namely, that evidence for p can, in some instances, justify a belief that p even if one’s possessing that evidence does not imply p (152–53). He takes such a move to be warranted because “particularist noninferential anti-skeptics [. . .] have very strong epistemic intuitions that at least some of their perceptual, memory, and a priori beliefs are [. . .] rational—intuitions that are much stronger than any epistemic intuitions they have in support of the key epistemic premises of skeptical arguments” (234–35; cf. 201–202, 222).

Why should our strong epistemic intuitions give us grounds for resisting conflicting claims? One possible answer is that rationality requires consistency in our beliefs and intuitions, and thus justifies jettisoning the more weakly held of any conflicting beliefs or intuitions. But this response faces at least three problems. First, it is not clear why such a response motivates a turn to epistemic intuitions rather than, for example, perceptual beliefs. Second, by Bergmann’s own lights, epistemic intuitions, as a kind of “seeming,” are not bound to consistency requirements; “it is not irrational to have explicitly conflicting seemings” (131). Third, one’s beliefs and intuitions may be consistent without being true, plausible, or well grounded. Someone with wildly implausible epistemic intuitions—ones she should not have—lacks grounds for resisting skeptical arguments.

Bergmann seems aware of this third problem. After all, he views some consistent sets of epistemic intuitions as “ridiculous” (192–96) or as calling for “questions or doubts” (186–87; cf. 183). Accordingly, he sometimes describes his anti-skepticism as depending on “rational” or “rationally held” epistemic intuitions. He says, for example, that “if a belief is rationally held with a very high degree of confidence, the skeptical objection must be extremely compelling if it is to make it rational to give up that belief” (258, my emphasis; cf. 253). But Bergmann is ambivalent about how important the modifier ‘rational is here. It is frequently dropped, and he also suggests an intermediate position—namely, that it is enough if the relative strengths of a person’s epistemic intuitions seem to her to be rational (186, 195, 201, 129, 208, 259). Bergmann’s ambivalence may perhaps reflect the fact that, by his lights, an intuition or belief that one’s strongly held epistemic intuitions are good ones would both make those intuitions appear rational and make it rational to believe them. But someone with wildly implausible epistemic intuitions could have this intuition. So we seem stuck with our third problem.

It is possible that Bergmann thinks this problem is to be solved later, by a more robust theory of rationality or justification. Indeed, Bergmann views it as a virtue of his “intuitionist approach” that it is “ecumenical in the sense that it can be adopted by both internalists and externalists, who will (of course) each go on to develop it [. . .] in their own differing ways.” This further development could presumably include conditions on what makes an epistemic intuition a good one. Bergmann highlights his “ecumenism” to “widen the appeal of this approach” (164), advertising its availability to those with very different epistemological commitments.

On the other hand, Bergmann clarifies that his anti-skeptical strategy is only available to those with robustly commonsense intuitions. The skeptic, as he normally portrays her, has stronger intuitions about the epistemic goodness of her general skeptical principles than of her particular perceptual or recollective beliefs (244–45; though 235n7). Accordingly, Bergmann is uninterested in what he calls “proselytizing,” or aiming “to persuade radical skeptics (by rational force!) to change their minds” (145–46). Instead, he engages in the “autodidactic” affair of “getting one’s own anti-skeptical house in order” (146–47). This is “to consider what a particularist noninferential anti-skeptic should think, in light of her own epistemic intuitions, about what rationality requires in response to the questions being raised” by skeptics (176n9, 199n16; cf. 146, 245n25). According to him, such a move can be “respectable” and “take skepticism seriously insofar as it [. . .] acknowledges the appeal of skeptical objections based on tempting epistemic intuitions in support of the epistemic principles the skeptic uses as premises” (147–48). The suggestion seems to be that the intuitionist particularist must feel some pull from skeptical principles—must “try to appreciate any force they have” (213)—but may ultimately reject them on the grounds of more strongly held epistemic intuitions about particular beliefs.

Bergmann does not, however, reject all of the principles operative in skeptical reasoning. Some must be adopted, he thinks, if one is to take skepticism seriously. These include the “New Evil Demon intuition”—the intuition that perception would present you with the same evidence it does now, while you are perceiving things as they really are, were everything to appear the same to you while victim to a demon’s deception (23). This intuition, along with analogues for our other core faculties, figures crucially in Bergmann’s skeptical arguments (as Premise 4). Disjunctivists attempt to avoid skepticism by denying this intuition. According to them, denying that the same evidence is made available in both genuine cases of perception and indistinguishable misperceptions allows us to hold onto the commonsense idea that genuine cases can provide conclusive evidence for what we seem to be perceiving. Such evidence is sufficient for forming knowledge on its basis. But attempting to disarm skepticism in this way, Bergmann claims, “underestimat[es] skepticism’s appeal” (24).

Can Bergmann explain why this is so? The intuition which disjunctivists deny may indeed be a common one. But so is the skeptical principle which Bergmann denies on the grounds of his epistemic intuitions; it, too, has been widely held (28) and “has some [. . .] appeal” (152). In general, I find Bergmann’s logic as to which skeptical principles must be felt or accepted, and to what degree, quite opaque. His “logic” may, in the end, depend on his own peculiar set of epistemic intuitions. But if it does, this reveals the extent to which his inquiry is truly “autodidactic.” It not only does not aim to change a skeptic’s mind. It does not even aim to convince commonsense anti-skeptics with differing epistemic intuitions. Bergmann acknowledges this point, at least with regard to those who have “ridiculous” anti-skeptical intuitions (196). But are the disjunctivist’s intuitions “ridiculous”? How about the anti-skeptic who feels that justification requires an awareness of the truth, or that companions-in-guilt objections are powerful, or that peer disagreement weakens one’s evidence? Bergmann claims that the intuitionist particularist will deny all three of these intuitions on pain of skepticism (166, 195, 250–51). But this suggests that anyone who holds these intuitions strongly will be unmoved. It threatens to reduce Bergmann’s intuitionist particularism to a mere self-report of his own intuitions and their relative strengths.

In this regard, Bergmann’s anti-skeptical project appears significantly more “modest” than that of other contemporary anti-skeptics who do not aim to persuade the skeptic, like Pryor or Timothy Williamson. But in one way it is more “ambitious”: Bergmann occasionally expresses a “hope” that his autodidactic inquiry could still recruit others—even skeptics—to his way of thinking (147, 249). But he leaves it mysterious what could lead this to occur. In particular, his intuitionist methodology suggests that it can never be rational to radically change one’s intuitions. That would seem to require rejecting stronger intuitions for weaker ones—or else some non-rational process of gaining new intuitions. This strikes me as a rather pessimistic view of philosophical dialectic. It seems tantamount to denying that we have any rational method or criterion for settling matters of belief and knowledge that is independent of what we happen to believe (or feel) already. I find it hard to see this view as distinct from skepticism itself. After all, who but a skeptic would deny that there is any non-arbitrary method or criterion for settling such matters?

Bergmann’s appeal to epistemic intuitions appears to reinforce the commonsense reply to skepticism. In the end, though, I think it does not help. How could its merely seeming to a person that his particular beliefs are justified give him insight into the sources of skepticism, or a stable way to resist it? Bergmann claims to channel Reid in insisting that it is rational to reject skepticism on the grounds of strongly held, commonsense intuitions. While there is a grain of truth in this, Bergmann overlooks the fact that Reid also develops a diagnosis. Nowhere in Bergmann do we find any vestige of Reid’s sustained attack on the “theory of ideas” as the root cause of skepticism (IHM 5.8). And without a developed diagnosis, it is hard to see Bergmann’s book as offering more than a report of his own felt resistance to skepticism.