Radical Skepticism and the Shadow of Doubt: A Philosophical Dialogue

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Eli Hirsch, Radical Skepticism and the Shadow of Doubt: A Philosophical Dialogue, Bloomsbury, 2018, 238pp., $24.95, ISBN 9781350033856.

Reviewed by Samuel Lebens, University of Haifa


The best dialogues avoid pitting strong intellects against yes-men. Instead, they present a real clash between diverse voices, forcing one another to refine their position in light of each other's criticisms. This allows the reader to see to the heart of the issues that divide the protagonists. Hirsch's dialogue does just that, and with wonderful theatricality.

Hirsch's richly conceived characters have just stepped outside of the study-hall of a rabbinical seminary (a Yeshiva), to discuss epistemology in the bathroom. At one point, the fourth-wall is broken, and the characters express their awareness that they are characters of Hirsch's creation. In this text, therefore, we find the cutting philosophical dialogue of a George Berkeley, a dash of the theatrical absurdism of a Samuel Beckett, and a hint of the knowing self-reference of a Bertold Brecht.

If the Berkeley-Beckett-Brecht combination isn't sufficient to whet your appetite, Hirsch throws in more than a soupçon of Talmudic allusion, and a distinctively Jewish sense of humour. One is reminded of the literature of the Haskalah.

Hirsch's three characters are Daniel, Yitzchak, and Lev. Daniel plays the role of an honest arbiter. The real philosophical action takes place between his two very different, ex-students-cum-colleagues, Yitzchak and Lev. All of the protagonists agree that, if we knew that we lived in a world in which some people were envatted (i.e., existed only as brains in vats), then we would have reason to doubt our so-called external reality. They imagine a character, Vatol, in just that situation. Vatol, they all agree, has reason to doubt. Lev thinks that our situation is no different to Vatol's. Yitzchak disagrees.

Having an experience that seems to suggest that p, according to Yitzchak, provides you with a defeasible presumption that p is the case. In Vatol's circumstances, that presumption is defeated -- by his knowledge that his world contains envatted people. In our circumstances, Yitzchak insists, the presumption holds. He goes to great lengths to explain why defeasibility constraints are violated in Vatol's situation but not in ours. He never quite succeeds, but he won't give up trying, given his 'Moorean confidence' that there is an external reality. As he puts it: 'I admit that I can't see my way through all of the tangles here, but that's not going to affect my confidence.' (p. 125). And it doesn't matter how obscure or convoluted all the tangles become (p. 138) since we

arrive at epistemic principles [irrespective of how tangled they may seem] by considering what we say intuitively about particular examples. It seems intuitively clear to most sane people that, given our experiences, we have no reason to doubt external reality. And it also seems intuitively clear, I think, that, given Vatol's experiences, he does have reason to doubt. The epistemic principles I've sketched [however incomplete] are designed to account for those intuitive reactions.

Two things baffle me about Yitzchak. If we know that we live in a world alongside envatted people, then Yitzchak concedes that we do have reason to doubt external reality. In one of his greatest dialectical victories over Yitzchak, Lev forces Yitzchak to concede, reluctantly, that it can't matter whether those envatted people live contemporaneously to Vatol or long before him, and that by parity of reason, it would make no difference whether those envatted people exist a long time in Vatol's future (pg. 81). Knowledge that such people exist, anywhere on Vatol's timeline, gives Vatol reason to adopt a radical skepticism; reason that -- according to Yitzchak -- we don't have. But we only don't have that reason to the extent that we're confident that there never will be envatted people -- even in the distant future.

I fear that Yitzchak hasn't been watching enough television. Anyone familiar with the series Black Mirror knows that the not-too-distant future could contain all sorts of vat-like people. Can we really rest our common-sense anti-skepticism on a speculation that the future contains no envatted people? Anyone who feels the force of this question, it seems to me, will recognise, with Lev, that even the possibility of envatting people should give us the same reason to doubt that Vatol has. Yitzchak is aware of these science fiction scenarios, but he argues that one would need sufficiently significant evidence for their probability (pp. 127-8). Why? Isn't their mere possibility sufficiently problematic? Yitzchak comes off weakly here. He hasn't done enough to persuade us that future people are different from possible people.

Now for my second concern. All of Hirsch's protagonists (p. 31) reject Putnam's semantic response to Brain-in-a-Vat skepticism (Putnam, 1981). Yet Yitzchak agrees to the following: if Vatol reads of a scientific finding that envatted people hear an intermittent whistle, and Vatol hears no such whistle, then Vatol no longer has reason to doubt that he's envatted; he knows that he's not (p. 123). Yitzchak is unmoved by the prospect that Vatol's envatted brother may have had experiences, caused by his vat, of reading about a scientific finding such that envatted people don't hear an intermittent whistle, and, since Vatol's brother does hear an intermittent whistle, he has as much reason as does Vatol to rest assured, from deep within his vat, that he's not a brain in a vat (pp. 124-5). I don't see how Yitzchak's position can make any sense at all, unless -- after reading of the respective scientific discoveries -- Vatol and his brother end up meaning different things by 'being a brain in a vat'. One meaning involves hearing intermittent whistling. The other meaning doesn't. Has Yitzchak really offered us something that far removed from a semantic response to skepticism?

A second semantic response is alluded to somewhat playfully (and perhaps unwittingly). David Chalmers is of the opinion that even if we are brains in vats, most of our beliefs remain intact (Chalmers, 2010). What we mean by 'tree' turns out to be 'simulated-tree', but most of our beliefs about them remain true. To find out that the deep structure of our world is explained by the computer running our vat is no more of a threat to our everyday knowledge than finding out that the deep structure of our world is explained by the vibrating one-dimensional strings of string theory. Sure, the world is weird at its fundamental physical and metaphysical level, but it remains pretty normal at its everyday level. That's all we need to defeat the radical skeptic. Perhaps Hirsch alludes to this when his characters momentarily realise that they are merely characters in Hirsch's dialogue. Does that make them any less real to themselves, in their own world? This line of inquiry isn't raised explicitly, but bubbles under the surface.

Lev's name means heart, and being French, he has something of the existentialist about him (despite his analytic training). According to Lev, the entire enterprise of analytic epistemology fails to engage with the heart of the problem of radical skepticism: that it gives rise to an anxiety that can't be expressed in words. Lev thinks that we do, just like Vatol, have reason to doubt our external reality, but also that it's impossible rationally to doubt our external reality. Accordingly, when we realise that we have reason to doubt, we also realise that we have reason to believe in something that's impossible to believe; impossible even to entertain. If it's impossible to entertain, then surely it's impossible to express. And thus, Lev calls it the shadow of doubt.

Here we run into a fundamental issue that divides Lev and Yitzchak. Frege insisted on a 'grain of salt' when he couldn't quite say what he wanted to. Wittgenstein sought to show the unsayable. Frank Ramsey, by contrast, opined that you cannot say what cannot be said, and you can't whistle it either. Lev seems to rely on the fact 'that some things can be expressed only in metaphor and poetry' (p. 219). The shadow of doubt is one of them. All the while, Yitzchak -- like a Frank Ramsey -- struggles to grasp what Lev is talking about.

Lev advances two novel arguments as to why it's impossible rationally to doubt our external reality. The first argument (p. 155):

  1. It is impossible for a being to value its life, or anything in its life, if it does not believe it has meaningfully interacted with other lives
  2. It is impossible for a being to be intellectually responsible if it does not value anything in its life
  3. Therefore: it is impossible to be an intellectually responsible being if one believes that one has never had meaningful interaction with other lives.

Our external world could be very matrix-like. Berkeleyan idealism could be true. As Chalmers would have it, such conclusions should rock us very little. Lev can agree to that. But what matters to Lev is that we can't believe that we're alone in such a world. Other lives -- real rather than simulated -- must have been plugged in alongside us at some point. If we don't believe that much, we will find no meaning in our lives (given premise 1), and if we find no meaning in our lives, we will fail to be intellectually responsible (given premise 2). Therefore: belief in an external world, at least containing other lives, is a pre-requisite of an intellectually responsible life.

Lev develops this argument further, as he defines what he means by intellectual responsibility. But sadly, the argument is incompatible with traditional Jewish (and Muslim) theism. These characters are in a Yeshiva. This incompatibility should have been raised.

The Christian Trinitarian can believe that God finds value in his own life, even before creating the world, in virtue of the interpersonal relations subsisting between the three persons within the Godhead. But Judaism rejects Trinitarianism and rejects the notion that God was compelled to create a world. It asserts that God is intellectually responsible, and that his life has infinite value. Accordingly, traditional Jewish theism has to reject premise 1. God would value his own life (since it's infinitely valuable) even without interaction with other lives; since he doesn't have to create a world at all.

Here's another reason why theists, even Trinitarian ones, might want to reject Lev's argument. It might well be possible to have meaningful relationships without fully believing others to exist. Andrew Cullison (2010) provides a series of thought-experiments in which he seems to describe fulsome relationships that are unsupported by outright belief in the existence of the other (see also Poston and Doughtery, 2007). Yitzchak pushes a similar line of thought: if we recognise that it's probable that our lives contain relationships with others, can't we value that probability (pp. 167-172)? Perhaps Yitzchak should have pushed harder: isn't our relationship with God a prime example of a relationship that is both subject to pervasive doubt and recognised by us to be the source of value in our lives?

Lev's second argument is similarly incompatible with traditional Jewish (and Muslim) monotheism (p.179):

  1. It is impossible for a being to have any degree of self-esteem if that being does not believe that it has meaningfully interacted with other lives
  2. It is impossible for a being to have a self if that being has no degree of self-esteem
  3. It is impossible for a being to be intellectually responsible if that being does not have a self
  4. Therefore: one cannot be an intellectually responsible being without believing that one has had meaningful interactions with other lives

If intellectual responsibility requires a self, then God must have a self (since he's intellectually responsible). If having a self requires self-esteem, then God must have self-esteem. But since God could have existed, in all of his perfection, without creating a world, the traditional Jew (and Muslim) must deny (at least) premise 1.

Lev needn't be bothered by any of these concerns. Yitzchak thinks that Lev's an atheist anyway (p. 149). Perhaps he's right. These concerns wouldn't move an atheist. Moreover, both arguments can be amended so as to address the criteria for human intellectual responsibility; whilst leaving God out of the picture. Or, they could be re-tooled to lead to a Maimonides-like conception of God that forbids us to predicate 'intellectual responsibility' or 'selfhood' of God. Alternatively, perhaps Lev adopts a heterodoxy: God has to create a world, and even then, he too suffers from the shadow of doubt (p. 151). But Lev's arguments are weaker to the extent that they cannot bring traditional theists along with them.

Nevertheless, we shouldn't forget: this conversation takes place in the bathroom and not the Yeshiva. This isn't a work about the philosophy of religion. The dialogue is distinctively Jewish -- but not because of theology. So, what makes it Jewish: the humour; the setting; the biographies of the characters? Christian philosophy, I imagine, is made Christian primarily in virtue of its theological commitments. Muslim philosophy might be the same. Jewish philosophy, by contrast, can be Jewish in a cultural sense, as Greek philosophy was Greek. Accordingly, Hirsch's three characters aren't explicitly interested in Jewish theology. Like most good Lithuanian-style Yeshiva students, their interest is in the legal wranglings of the Talmud. In other work, Hirsch (1999, 2006) has demonstrated how an intimate knowledge of those legal discussions can shed interesting light upon issues in metaphysics. In this work, he does the same for epistemology. He is aware that deep philosophical issues might truly be at stake in his Talmudic sources, but he's also aware that they might not be (p. 98). Either way, the parallels can be illuminating. By applying Jewish jurisprudence to analytical metaphysics and epistemology, Hirsch is something of a pioneer of a style of distinctively Jewish philosophy that isn't intended to be philosophy of religion.

Hirsch's book is illuminating, it charts new territory, and lays out old territory in a new light. The Talmudic allusions are enlightening, and the narrative detours are entertaining. The glossary could have been more comprehensive, but non-Jewish readers shouldn't be put off (especially if armed with Google). I hope this book receives critical attention. More importantly, I hope that it's widely read. It is first-class philosophical literature.


This review was made possible through the support of a grant from Templeton World Charity Foundation, Inc. The opinions expressed in this publication are those of the author and do not necessarily reflect the views of Templeton World Charity Foundation, Inc. Thanks also to Tyron Goldschmidt and Aaron Segal for looking over an earlier draft.


Chalmers, D. J., 2010. The Matrix as Metaphysics. In: The Character of Consciousness . Oxford University Press, pp. 455-494.

Cullison, A., 2010. Two Solutions to the Problem of Divine Hiddenness. American Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 47, pp. 119-35.

Hirsch, E., 1999. Identity in the Talmud. Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 23(1), p. 166–180.

Hirsch, E., 2006. Rashi's view of the open future: indeterminateness and bivalence. In: D. W. Zimmerman, ed. Oxford studies in metaphysics. Oxford University Press, pp. 111-135.

Poston, T. and Doughtery, T., 2007. Divine Hiddenness and the Nature of Belief. Religious Studies, 43(2), p. 183–198.

Putnam, H., 1981. Reason, Truth and History. Cambridge University Press