Rancière Now: Current Perspectives on Jacques Rancière

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Oliver Davis (ed.), Rancière Now: Current Perspectives on Jacques Rancière, Polity, 2013, 250pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745662572.

Reviewed by Samuel A. Chambers, Johns Hopkins University


Political theorists have spent a decade or more demanding/extracting from the writings of Jacques Rancière a new or distinct theory of politics. Now, film theorists, literary theorists, art historians, and philosophers of aesthetics would very much like Rancière to produce, or for them to produce for him, a theory of art or aesthetics. Neither broad group, it would sometimes seem, has genuinely taken on board Rancière's unceasing assertion that he has no "theory" of anything whatsoever. But why, beyond his own refusals and declamations, might we positively affirm the idea that Rancière's writings contain no theory?

The present book operates mainly in the same areas as Rancière himself has worked for almost the past twenty years -- the fields of cinema, art, and literature. To analyze those writings, and to engage with these essays, serves as one way to respond to this crucial query. Let me sketch an answer by first noting that as I write this  (such conditions change very quickly) Rancière's newest major work is Aisthesis: Scènes du régime esthétique de l'art (Galilée 2011), a book now available in English translation (Verso 2013) but which the authors of the volume under review only had access to in the original French. Whether despite or because of its newness, Aisthesis casts a serious gravitational pull on this collection: while the book is divided into three sections, a full half of the twelve chapters appear in the third and final section (titled "Literature, Film, Art, Aesthetics"), all but one of which focus heavily on this important new book. Oddly, given the importance of the eponymous text, none of the contributors offers anything like a definition of the ancient Greek term, aisthēsis. However, in this they join Rancière himself, who says simply but elliptically in the "Prelude" of his new book that "Aisthesis designates the mode of experience according to which, for two centuries, we have perceived very diverse things, whether in their techniques of production or their destination, as all belonging to art" (Rancière 2013: x, alternate translation). Here Rancière defines not so much aisthēsis, but rather "the aesthetic regime of art" -- his unique attempt to capture a new way of ordering/perceiving works of art in which art (now, and for the first and only time, in the singular) no longer belongs to a predetermined location within the social order, but rather circulates in a potential process of ordering and disordering of that very social order.

To get at a richer and more grounded meaning of the Greek term aisthēsis, one needs to turn back to Rancière's most famous text putatively "on politics," the text from which many believe he has shifted away in this most recent period of writing "on art and aesthetics." The word aisthēsis appears early in La mésentente, a text peppered with ancient Greek words. However, unlike most of those terms (e.g., dēmos, archē, logos, kratos) -- which Rancière frequently does conceptual work with, using the terms in their untranslated form -- Rancière approaches aisthēsis differently, more obliquely. He appears to define the term somewhat casually when he merely gives a parenthetical alternative, by referring to "aisthesis -- le partage du sensible" (Rancière 1995: 87). One could safely argue that "le partage du sensible" proves to be the most pivotal term in Rancière's corpus over the past 25 years -- it can even be projected back into early texts that precede its enunciation (Panagia 2010). But the phrase itself appears first in La mésentente, and it shows up precisely in a parenthetical that serves to translate the term that proves so central to the present book-- aisthēsis.

By rendering aisthēsis as "le partage du sensible" in this earlier text, Rancière clearly signals the deep connection between distribution/partition, on the one hand, and the realm of sensibility, on the other. Writing just one year after the publication of La mésentente, and again linking the phrase with Greek terms, Rancière says:

we will call partage du sensible a generally implicit law that defines the forms of part-taking by first defining the modes of perception in which they are inscribed, the nemein [distribution] upon which are founded the nomoi [laws] of the community. This partage should be understood in the double sense of the word: on the one hand, that which separates and excludes; on the other, that which allows participation. (Rancière 1998: 176, my translation).

Of course, "le partage du sensible" has often been loosely translated as "the politics of aesthetics," most prominently in the book by that name. Despite this move,the phrase ought to indicate something quite different -- namely, the very impossibility of separating politics from aesthetics. Aisthēsis points not merely to a dimension of the world -- the sensory realm -- but to the very dividing up, patterning, and distribution of the world that makes it available to the senses in the first place. Gabriel Rockhill rightly contends that the sensible/sensory must not be mistaken for something that "shows good sense" but rather grasped as "what is aisthēton or capable of being apprehended by the senses" (Rockhill 2004: 85). One could thus translate "le partage du sensible" back into the ancient Greek, as follows: the nemein of the aisthēton.

And this brings me back to the start, with the formulation of a potential reason why Rancière has no theory of politics or aesthetics: because his understanding of aisthēsis as "le partage du sensible" continuously and consistently thwarts/undermines/denies/refuses any effort whatsoever to disentangle politics from aesthetics -- much less to develop an analytic or theory of either. One might, in an (over)simplifying move that helps account for a wide diversity of contributions, distinguish the essays in this volume by whether they choose to follow Rancière's in his "thwarting moves" or whether they work against Rancière on this issue -- either seeking to construct the very theories Rancière denies, or criticizing him for his failure to do so.

One can observe this sort of difference in the opening two chapters of the book (in the "Politics" section). Jackie Clarke rehearses Rancière's now well-known and unique sense of "politics," before launching her criticisms: first, that his conception of politics is too evanescent, failing to give an account of social movements and political mobilization, and second, that he fixes and reifies the (hierarchical) social order he theorizes. The first critique sounds all-too-familiar, as it has been strongly argued by numerous commentators -- and replied to by many others. For this reason it seems a shame that Clarke does not address any of the now quite sizable literature on Rancière and politics. The latter charge rings strangely, since in order to mount it, Clarke must simply ignore all of those places in Rancière's corpus where he resolutely denies the fixity of the social order and consistently insists upon the very contingency of its hierarchy. Quoting from On the Shores of Politics, Clarke writes that "the 'social bond' for Rancière is always a product of 'the weight of things'," thereby setting up her critical charge that, for Rancière, "the social world itself appears fixed, allowing no possibility of change" (22, 23). But one can only move from Rancière's claims about gravity in the social order to the conclusion that his account of the social order is frozen in place if one entirely misses Rancière's own emphasis: to describe the social order as a natural order is always to naturalize a hierarchy and domination that is always anything but natural. Rancière himself always responds to such naturalizing moves with his own polemical assertion that such efforts at naturalization are never anything more than the work of policing. Ultimately the social order is never a natural order: "convention alone can reign in the social order" (Rancière 1991: 78). So, yes, the social order does "appear" fixed, but not because it really is fixed, but because of the forces of the police that would like the reigning of mere convention to come off as something else entirely. Jeremy Lane's chapter can be read as providing a fuller elaboration of this very riposte to Clarke. Lane exemplifies his overall thesis in lines that offer a succinct and powerful answer to Clarke. Working through Rancière's reading of Plato's "noble lie," Lane writes:

The very fact, however, that Plato has recourse to a lie, to fiction, to literature to legitimize this social order reveals that there is nothing natural [or fixed] about this at all. In the very act of seeking to naturalize a hierarchical social order, Plato reveals that order's inherent contingency (39, emphasis mine).

Rancière's reading of Plato is not the production of a "theory of" the social order as natural, as given, as fixed; it is instead a polemical engagement with Plato's theory, one that -- as Rancière puts it in this volume -- refuses "the metaphysical request" to construct an alternative theory. If one reads Rancière looking for "his theory of" the social order, one might well come to the (mistaken) critical conclusions that Clarke draws; to resist the ontologizing move is also to draw to light Rancière's very denaturalizing moves, as Lane shows.

The second section of the book perhaps does not fit or flow as well with either the better-known ideas from the first section or the more popular recent writings of the third section, but it does contain two unique essays that are real gems of this collection. Carolyn Steedman has produced a wonderful historical, literary, and political account of "Reading Rancière" in 1979 at Ruskin College, Oxford. In a beautiful essay that never tries to "get Rancière right" or score points in academic debate, Steedman manages to bring to life a certain Rancièrean sensibility or ethos, while simultaneously reconstructing an important history of labor history. This chapter is followed by an essay by Caroline Pelletier and Tim Jarvis, who self-identify as "teachers" of Education and Creative Writing. Their innovative appropriation of Rancière's writing on teaching and learning mobilizes a powerful critique of the pedagogy of Creative Writing as it has become standardly practiced/taught in the UK, US, and Australia. While I am not situated in the fields to which they speak most directly, it still seems clear to me that their critique here should resonate across those fields and call for serious rethinking of Creative Writing pedagogic practices. Close readers of Rancière might easily make the mistake of assuming that this "application" of Rancière to Creative Writing would be of no interest to them; I caution such readers to avoid this too-simple assumption, since in many ways what Pelletier and Jarvis are up to here says more about the core ideas that animate Rancière's work than even the best synthetic summary of Rancière ever could. To refuse to offer an exegesis of Rancière's texts is, of course, to eschew the role of the stultifying master, and the two chapters that I have highlighted from this section do this brilliantly.

This brings me to the third and final section, and as I indicated above, to the real crux of this volume's contribution -- and to the payoff of the book's title. The section opens with extended and sophisticated efforts by Joseph Tanke and Oliver Davis, respectively, to work against or move past Rancière's efforts to think aesthetics and politics within the ambit of le partage du sensible. Tanke calls Rancière out for his failure to articulate "the nature of the aesthetic as such," for the limitations of his approach's capacity to grasp "aesthetic experience," and for his failure to admit that "the aesthetic" as produced by modern western philosophy contains "reactionary" and elitist tendencies and sensibilities (123, 134). For his part, and similarly, Davis fully recognizes Rancière's refusal to produce a theory of art or aesthetics, but he nonetheless thinks it possible and important to do so anyway, to construct from Rancière's writings (and sometimes against them) "a single, unified, account of the politics of (aesthetic) art" (156). There is clearly a mésentente between Rancière and Tanke and Davis: Tanke consistently attempts to think through "the aesthetic" as a product of modern philosophy that must be grasped and worked with as an object, whereas it seems clear on my reading of Rancière that there is no such thing as "the aesthetic," certainly not as an object created by the discourse of philosophy. There is the possibility of seeing and discovering, in the historical transformations of works of art, the emergence of "the aesthetic regime of art," and there is aisthēsis; but from the Rancièrean perspective, there is no sensible way of talking about "the aesthetic" as if it were an independent, transhistorical object. Something similar could be said for Davis's effort to construct a theory of the "aesthetic effect," which would be "formative of an emancipatory political consciousness and emancipatory political looking and feeling" (163). It is not that, from Rancière's perspective, art might not have such an effect -- surely it does -- but that the effort to systematize "effects on subjects" can never be anything other than an attempt to construct a new police order.

Between Tanke and Davis's important pieces Davis (as editor) has wisely chosen to place Tom Conley's tour de force reading of Rancière's two most recent texts (in French) -- Les écarts du cinéma and Aisthesis. Directly in its title, "Savouring the Surface," Conley's essay announces a certain fidelity to what I described above as Rancière's thwarting moves: Conley chooses to "read" Rancière on the surface, rather than seek to construct a depth or fullness that Rancière himself would eschew. In so doing, what otherwise might read as something like a "mere" review essay by Conley, comes to light as a radical articulation of Rancière's ideas, in contrast and some tension with the reconstructions of theoretical positions offered (before and after Conley's piece) by Tanke and Davis. The three essays, read together, offer readers of this volume a very clear perspective on the epistemological, historical, and political stakes of Rancière's work today.

After a very helpful and potentially important (particularly to Deleuzeans) comparative analysis by Bill Marshall of the affinities (and gaps) between Rancière's work on film and the well-known cinema projects of Deleuze, the volume moves toward its significant peroration with two dialogic pieces. For many readers -- particularly those who already know Rancière's primary texts and the secondary literature quite well -- the real jewel of this collection may prove to be the short exchange between Rancière and Jean-Luc Nancy. Titled in such a way as to note the continuity with a widely-read earlier essay by Nancy (in Rockhill and Watts, 2009), this piece begins with two questions (posed over three pages of text) from Nancy to Rancière, followed by a potent and substantive response by Rancière, and ending with a rejoinder from Nancy. The exchange is important because Nancy so effectively draws Rancière out on issues/themes/problems that have been foremost on the mind of many readers of Rancière over the years. And Rancière's responses bring out dimensions of his thought that have perhaps not been clear heretofore. To the first query, Rancière's latest refusal of "the metaphysical request" sharpens the political and historical stakes of both the request and its refusal. To the second query, Rancière gives a response that clarifies not only his position on "art and aesthetics" but once again (and always) his thinking of politics. Pushed by Nancy to recognize a common aesthetic experience, Rancière responds lucidly:

Art, for us, designates a certain relation between procedures, forms of sensibility, and significations. [It] allows us to include, as objects of our sensible experience, assemblages that are made for completely different ends. What we cannot do -- in any case, what I cannot do -- is to presuppose a universality of the form of experience through which we feel them as art. . . . the impassable lesson of Vico and Hegel [is] that we see or understand as art that which, for those who produced it, had been something different. [But] neither of them hesitated to announce the meaning that the thing in question would have had for the sacred poets or the builders of pyramids. I find this impossible to do. (196-97, all but first emphasis mine)

The vacillation between first person plural and first person singular here serves to index, I would suggest, the importance of these claims to Rancière's own self-understanding of his project. As he explains later in this response, the "common" must always be defined "in its difference with another common" (197). Hence, Rancière's refusal to produce a philosophy of "the aesthetic," his resistance to any move that would locate the "universal experience" of art -- none of this can be dissociated from his thinking of politics as dissensus. "Politics and art define ways of tying sense and sense together that are opposed to others" (197, emphasis added). For this reason there cannot be an aesthetic, much less an aesthetic "experience"; any theory of art or aesthetics would also be a theory of politics (and vice versa), but the effort to produce such a theory could never evade the entanglement with an (a)political project of policing. The project of art or politics (if there is such a thing) can only be carried out by historical engagements, by the method of the scene, by writing as literarity.


Panagia, Davide (2010). "The Sharing of the Sensible," in Jean-Philippe Deranty (ed.), Jacques Rancière: Key Concepts. London: Acumen; 95-103.

Rancière, Jacques (1991). The Ignorant Schoolmaster: Five Lessons in Intellectual Emancipation. Translated by Kristin Ross. Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Rancière, Jacques (1995). La mésentente: politique et philosophie. Paris: Galilée.

Rancière, Jacques (1998). Aux bords du politique. Second ed. Paris: La Fabrique.

Rancière, Jacques (2011). Les écarts du cinéma. Paris: La Fabrique.

Rancière, Jacques (2013). Aisthesis: Scenes from the Aesthetic Regime of Art. Translated by Zakir Paul. London: Verso.

Rockhill, Gabriel (2004). "Preface, Introduction, and Glossary," in Gabriel Rockhill (ed), The Politics of Aesthetics. London and New York: Continuum; vii- x; 1-6; 80-93.

Rockhill, Gabriel and Philip Watts (eds.) (2009). Jacques Rancière: History, Politics, Aesthetics. Durham: Duke University Press.