Rational Animals: The Teleological Roots of Intentionality

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Mark Okrent, Rational Animals: The Teleological Roots of Intentionality, Ohio University Press, 2007, 222pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780821417447.

Reviewed by Matthew Ratcliffe, Durham University


This book offers a new account of the intentionality of mental states and behaviour. Okrent observes that intentionality is philosophically troublesome for three main reasons. First of all, there seems to be no place for it in the physical, scientifically described world; second, intentionality can involve relations with things that don't exist; and third, intentional states are normative. In recent philosophy of mind, a popular strategy has been to analyse intentionality in terms of biological teleology. Consider a statement such as "the function of ears is to hear things". This is normative -- if your ears ceased to detect sound, then they would be malfunctioning, doing something wrong. In addition, something can have the function of bringing about a kind of event, even if such an event has not yet happened, as in the case of a bee that has never used its sting. So functions can involve relations with non-actual states of affairs. Thus, if functions can also be understood as non-mysterious features of the natural world, the possibility arises of analysing intentionality naturalistically by grounding it in biological function.

Okrent agrees with the view that intentionality is to be understood in biological terms. However, he departs from the usual approach in two interesting and important ways. First of all, he suggests that we should appeal to goals, rather than functions. Second, he reverses the generally accepted order of dependence between the intentionality of mental states and the goal-directedness of behaviour. Rather than assuming that behavioural teleology is dependent upon the contents of internal mental states that cause it, Okrent argues that goal-directedness is the primary phenomenon. An entity can be intrinsically goal-directed even if it has no internal intentional states. He proposes that all intentionality is embedded in goal-directed behaviour: "Intentionality is rooted in teleology; the aboutness of mental life is rooted in the goal-directedness of active life" (p.xi).

The argument of the book proceeds in three stages. Okrent first offers an account of goal-directed behaviour that does not depend upon an appeal to the intentionality of mental states. He notes that we routinely explain animal behaviour in terms of goals, even when it is clear that the organism in question is not sophisticated enough to possess intentional states. It could be maintained that attributions of goal-directedness in such cases are metaphorical. But Okrent instead argues that behaviour can be intrinsically goal-directed, even when it is not guided by mental states such as beliefs and desires. Central to his argument is the claim that goals are "strongly holistic". They are 'holistic' because the attribution of a goal is only possible in the context of a series of other goals, and they are 'strongly' holistic because the possibility of assigning goal p requires that p be related in quite specific ways to other goals. Okrent draws an analogy with natural numbers: for number 6 to be possible, there must also be other numbers and, furthermore, 6 must relate to other numbers in a particular way, such as 'before 7 and after 5' (p.57). He notes that, due to the interdependence of goals, goal-attribution involves a hermeneutic circle, whereby an understanding of the parts (individual goals) and of the whole (a system of goals) feed off each other.

To formulate an account of intrinsic goal-directedness, Okrent then turns to agents rather than actions. Living things have intrinsic goals, in terms of which all their holistically interrelated behavioural goals are to be understood. What is distinctive about living things is that they behave in such a way as to preserve their structure, thus standing out against the more general trend toward disequilibrium. Okrent adds that the goal of an organism need not simply be 'survival' and that reproduction, for example, can also be an intrinsic goal around which other goal-directed activities are organised. Which intrinsic goal we assign to an organism is, he says, dependent on an appreciation of the type of creature that it is. Hence an intrinsically goal-directed agent is a being that perpetuates disequilibrium in a distinctive way; different intrinsic goals belong to different types of organism; and behaviours have goals in so far as they contribute to the intrinsic goal of a type of organism:

to say that S does B for the sake of G implies that S is a certain type of organic agent, that agents of that type have a certain intrinsic goal, G*, that they typically accomplish through first realizing G by doing something similar to B, and that B occurs because S is at that first stage of its life process at which agents of its type realize G* by first realizing G by doing something similar to B. So, in this view, what goal-directed attributions explain is why the event that has the goal occurs. (p.83)

Okrent's second task is to offer an account of instrumentally rational action as a distinctive subspecies of goal-directed behaviour and, in the process, to show how belief and desire come into the picture. Goal-directed behaviours can be rigid, automated and vulnerable to interfering factors. But instrumentally rational behaviour is distinctive in being adaptable, often idiosyncratic and also modifiable in the light of past mistakes: "We introduce rational explanation only when we encounter a goal-directed agent that is very good at achieving its goals in very many situations" (p.124). The goal of an instrumentally rational action can be unique, applicable only to a single instance of action. However, even such one-off actions are intelligible insofar as they contribute to the typical goals of a kind of organism.

Okrent suggests that 'belief' and 'desire' are to be understood in terms of their roles in the explanation of instrumentally rational action. The attribution of these states is inextricable from the appreciation of an action as rational. The content of a desire maps onto the goal that it is invoked to explain, and the content of a belief specifies the conditions under which an action would succeed in reaching its goal (p.106). As Okrent observes, the result of his discussion is a more elaborate version of what Dennett calls the 'intentional stance', whereby rationality and holistic belief-desire relations contribute to an explanatory strategy that is especially fruitful when it comes to explaining certain adaptable behaviours. What the stance also incorporates (and what Dennett misses) is the assignment of goals to types of agent, something that is presupposed by the attribution of beliefs and desires (pp.125-6).

Finally, Okrent considers what is distinctive about human intentionality. Not all human actions, he concedes, are instrumentally rational. For example, we often act out of principle, in a way that may be detrimental to our organism. He sketches an account of the relationship between instrumentally rational action and acting upon a principle, according to which the instrumentally rational thing for highly social, adaptable creatures to do is regulate their actions according to principles. He adds that principles are often specific to certain kinds of social role, such as 'carpenter', and rightly observes that an appreciation of roles often allows us to predict and explain actions without recourse to the attribution of beliefs and desires. An appreciation of roles is closely associated with a normative, holistic understanding of tools. One of the most important tools we use is language and this, Okrent explains, is what allows us to attribute such detailed, fine-grained intentional contents. Without language, mental contents would be much vaguer, as they are in other species.

Thus, according to Okrent's account, human intentionality originates in a particularly sophisticated variant of rational behaviour, which is itself a distinctive kind of goal-directed behaviour. All intentionality is therefore rooted in goal-directedness. By emphasising goals rather than functions, and thus drawing attention to a neglected possibility, the book makes a significant contribution to current philosophical debate concerning intentionality.

One thing that I would like to have seen further clarified is the ontological status of 'beliefs' and 'desires'. Okrent alternates between references to having beliefs and desires and references to the role that these concepts play in explanation. Although he sometimes says that he is concerned primarily with ontology, his account of mental states consistently emphasises their role in the explanation of behaviour. Suppose person A attributes a mental state with content p to person B. What is the ontological status of that state? According to Okrent's account, B's mental state only has content p in virtue of its being explicable in p-terms by A or someone else:

this pragmatic account asserts that the content of an intentional state of an agent arises out of the role of that state in the explanation of and rational justification for the actions of the agent, rather than being a feature a state can have independent from its role in the explanation of action. (p.163)

Okrent also maintains throughout the book that certain kinds of non-human organisms have beliefs and desires. But it would seem that they do so only in so far as human beings are disposed to explain their behaviour in such terms (assuming only humans employ such explanations). Certain characteristics of organisms, such as their degree of adaptability, may well make the attribution of beliefs and desires more or less appropriate (according to some criterion or another). However, even if 'belief' and 'desire' do feature in an explanatory strategy that is more appropriate in some cases than others, this need not imply that the organisms whose behaviour is explained actually have beliefs and desires. Indeed, it might be that beliefs and desires do not exist at all, other than as concepts that feature in a contingent set of species-specific explanatory practices. Okrent does offer some indication of what beliefs and desires are, indicating that they are states rather than events (p.148) and that a state's content is "a matter of that state's having an abstract relational property" (p.164). However, a bit more discussion of why it is that certain things are properly explicable in such terms would have been helpful.

Okrent's view resembles, in many respects, the positions of philosophers such as Dennett and Davidson. There is also a hint of Millikan. In the Preface, he explains that it is also inspired by his understanding of Heidegger, even though it is not about Heidegger or "framed" in explicitly "Heideggerian terms". He adds that, although written in an analytic style, the book draws on insights from both analytic and Continental traditions (xii-xv). But the discussion that follows is rooted much more firmly in the analytic tradition and I was surprised at how 'un-Heideggerian' much of it is. Okrent does follow Heidegger in emphasising the practical aspects of intentionality and holistic frameworks of goal-directedness, but Heidegger only makes an explicit appearance in the final chapter, when normative social roles and holistic networks of equipment are discussed. Okrent also stresses two major differences between his view and that of Heidegger. Unlike Heidegger, he argues that humans are "rational animals" and, in addition, acknowledges that at least some non-human animals possess intentionality. However, a potentially more substantial difference is that Okrent accepts from the outset the aim of providing a naturalistic account of intentionality, based in biology. Heidegger's view in Being and Time is -- at least as I understand it - very different. He maintains that any empirical scientific account of things presupposes a more fundamental but largely tacit understanding of our relationship with the world. Intentionality, for Heidegger, cannot be comprehensively explained in scientific terms because any scientific conception of it will continue to take for granted this intentional accomplishment. Okrent's 'naturalism' is most likely more permissive than certain other doctrines that go by that name. Even so, it struck me as a fairly significant departure from Heidegger's philosophical starting point.

Of course, the fact that a position departs from that of Heidegger in certain ways is not in itself a philosophical objection, although more 'Continental' readers are likely to be disappointed and to find themselves in somewhat unfamiliar philosophical territory. I wonder, though, whether certain aspects of Okrent's view might be vulnerable to a broadly Heideggerian critique. For example, Okrent assumes throughout the book that the concepts of belief and desire are central to the explanation of rational human action. Heidegger, in contrast, suggests that other people's activities make sense to us in so far as they are bound up with a context of mutually understood norms and equipment, which we take for granted in the form of a shared world. For Heidegger, any inference regarding other people's mental states presupposes this shared context of practical belonging. Okrent does acknowledge that normative social roles and webs of equipment play an important part in regulating and understanding human action, but seems to suggest that belief-desire psychology is more fundamental. However, it is debatable whether we actually do explain, in terms of beliefs and desires, all or most of those adaptable, spontaneous behaviours that Okrent refers to as 'rational' or that our ability to respond to them in a sophisticated way requires us to employ a belief-desire psychology. Consider the following:

if an agent acts in a way that can be successful only if some other agent has some particular intentional psychological state, it seems that there is no option but to assume that the first agent has inferred the presence of that state from the evidence that is sensibly available to it in the behaviour of another. (p.120)

This strikes me as implausible. One agent's behaviour could track another agent's intentional states without actually inferring them (assuming, of course, that agents have intentional states independent of other agents' explanatory practices). Responding to others in a spontaneous, adaptable manner often involves a kind of affective, perceptual attunement to their behaviour; unthinking, skilful, bodily interaction rather than the attribution of internal mental states. Consider dancing, for example, where elaborate, spontaneous, adaptable bodily coordination is achieved between people but the attribution of mental states by one party to the other, such as 'x believes that p and desires that q and so will put her left foot forward and swing her right arm back', seems very unlikely. The matter is further complicated by the fact that an organism can act so as to put another organism in a particular state, rather than having to infer what state it is in. Humans do this all the time.

Some non-human animals are clearly able to interact in what Okrent would term a 'rational' way, meaning that they respond in an appropriate fashion to behaviours that are adaptable and perhaps even unique. But presumably they do not possess the relevant explanatory strategy (at least, the overwhelming consensus is that they do not). Hence, in our own case, one might likewise question the extent to which people understand and explain adaptable behaviour in terms of beliefs and desires. Consider returning a ball in a game of tennis. The action appears to fulfil Okrent's criteria for rationality; it is goal-directed, adaptable and, in certain respects, unique. Does this complicated feat of coordination depend upon belief and desire attribution? I would say not. It is a swift, skilful, bodily response, which does not rely upon an inference concerning one's situation or an opponent's mental states. Yet, at the same time, the player tracks the opponent's behaviour in quite a sophisticated, flexible way. It is just this kind of practical, bodily or 'motor' intentionality that phenomenologists such as Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty emphasise.

One could maintain, as Okrent does in the final chapter, that skilful, normative engagement with a situation does depend upon one's having beliefs and desires or perhaps one's attributing them. Thus, in human beings, rational agency (with the associated intentional states) comes first and other abilities rest upon it. For example:

Because most human roles involve the use of tools, human action from principle thus typically involves both beliefs regarding how agents of a sort are to act and beliefs regarding how different sorts of equipment are to be used by agents of that sort. (p.198)

However, I am not sure why a grasp of 'belief' and 'desire' should be construed as more fundamental to the understanding and explanation of action than a practical, perceptual, skilful appreciation of norms, roles, equipment and activities. To be fair, Okrent does understand 'belief' and 'desire' in a more liberal way than many philosophers, as exemplified by his insistence that a range of organisms have them. Even so, it seems likely that the relevant explanatory strategy is not as pervasive as he suggests. Adaptable and even unique behaviours, which make sense in the context of a person's life, can be and routinely are explained in a range of ways -- in terms of norms, roles, situations, perceptions, skills, character, commitments and principles, habits and a range of emotions and feelings. Why should belief-desire explanation be privileged?

In summary, I have some concerns regarding the ontological status of 'belief' and 'desire' and the emphasis that Okrent places upon them. All the same, this book makes a number of important points, which are certainly worthy of further discussion. It offers an original approach to the problem of intentionality, and a refreshing alternative to the usual emphasis on internal mental states and biological functions. Thus it will significantly enrich current discussion of intentionality and teleology.