Rationality and Feminist Philosophy

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Deborah K. Heikes, Rationality and Feminist Philosophy, Continuum, 2010, 173pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441161277.

Reviewed by Alessandra Tanesini, Cardiff University


This book is a defence of rationality, at least partly, on feminist grounds. In it Heikes argues that feminists should embrace rationality rather than giving it a bad press. There are, broadly speaking, two strands to Heikes' argument. First, she claims that concepts dear to feminists such as justice, fairness, equality and rights are largely indefensible without a conception of 'autonomous rationality' (p. 16). Second, she argues that feminists should stop flogging a dead horse, since mainstream philosophy has largely abandoned the Cartesian conception of rationality that feminists like to flog.

The argument for the second strand constitutes the backbone of the book which proceeds by way of an analysis of the shortcomings of several historical theories of rationality in order to demonstrate that these are not shared by all contemporary approaches. In particular, Heikes claims, a virtue theory of rationality avoids the pitfalls of Cartesian, Humean and Kantian views. The argument for the first strand is interspersed throughout the book, but finds a more sustained treatment in chapters 1, 2 and 9. It is this aspect of the book that I want to consider first.

Heikes is not the first feminist to claim that feminist political commitments can only be articulated using moral and political concepts which are inextricably intertwined with specific conceptions of rationality. Her arguments proceed along familiar lines. In what follows, I present them by adding some of the detail which I take to be implicit in Heikes' argument.

Feminists claim that women as a group are discriminated against in several aspects of their lives; they also claim that such discrimination is unjust, wrong and unfair. Heikes, quoting Nancy Hartsock, Sandra Harding and Seyla Benhabib, argues that any defence of these claims presupposes three broad philosophical commitments: (1) an epistemological commitment to truth and to objectivity; (2) a commitment to normativity and (3) a commitment to robust notions of agency and selfhood (pp. 19-21). With regard to the first commitment, Heikes notes that it is central to feminist views that claims about discrimination be defensible as accurate descriptions of social reality. Hence, feminists must commit to the ineliminability of the notion of truth (which is not to say that they must commit to metaphysically robust conceptions of this notion). If every utterance is a mere opinionated assertion, then there is no space for feminist commitments to be defended (as there is no space for any other commitments of any sort to be defended). But Heikes wishes to go beyond this point and claim that feminists must commit to some version of objectivity in epistemology. More specifically, in her view feminists must commit to the idea that feminist claims can always be defended by way of reasons whose normative force is binding on all.

The second commitment is to the existence of normative standards (p. 20). Heikes does not explicitly elaborate on this commitment. Clearly, it minimally entails that what the majority takes to be right, fair, true or correct is not necessarily so. Heikes appears to think that it also entails some kind of commitment to cognitivism in meta-ethics and the epistemology of morality, but as far as I can tell provides no explicit argument to this effect. Heikes' own commitment to cognitivism is apparent in her sympathetic reading of Kant to whom she dedicates chapter 5 of this book, and perhaps also in her support of rationality as a virtue which she describes as a kind of 'responsiveness to our environment' which requires 'learning to adapt through the cultivation of cognitive faculties' (p. 154).

The third commitment is to substantive notions of agency and selfhood. Whilst Heikes does not explicitly elaborate the point in much detail, her position is well taken. It would be rather self-defeating if feminists thought that personal autonomy was neither desirable nor achievable. Nevertheless, as feminist debates on the topic illustrate this is a difficult matter whose relation to the topic of rationality is complex. It is a pity that Heikes does not pursue this theme in any detail.

As I noted above, the main theme running through the book is that feminists should not reject all mainstream theories of rationality. In order to substantiate this claim Heikes first offers an overview of various theories of rationality since Descartes. The purpose of this overview is to show that the truly objectionable features of classical views such as those put forward by Descartes, Hume and Kant are not shared by their contemporary mainstream successors. Second, Heikes offers an overview of two such contemporary theories which in her view can be combined to result in an approach to rationality to which feminists should be sympathetic. The two theories are Nozick's account of rationality as an evolved ability and Audi's account of it as a virtue.

In spite of the brevity of the treatments, the traits of early modern accounts Heikes finds objectionable are reasonably clear. She rejects Descartes' dualism of mind and body, Hume's instrumentalism about reason and Kant's lack of recognition of the social dimension of reason. However, she also thinks that there is something worth saving in all of these views. In particular, she appreciates Descartes' commitment to the idea that human beings possess reason in equal measure, Hume's endorsement of the importance of passions and Kant's commitment to the universality of reason as responsiveness to reality.

As a matter of fact, Heikes' judgements are probably shared by the majority of feminist philosophers. I do not see, however, why denying them should contradict any feminist commitments. Yet this is precisely what Heikes claims. In particular she argues that that the objectionable features of classical theories of rationality make it hard to support on rational grounds the justice of the cause of women's equality. For instance, she argues that Hume's instrumentalism about reason makes it impossible to object to inequality as unjust unless the social utility of equality can be shown. For this reason, Heikes concludes that Hume's view should not be adopted by feminists. Her argument is not convincing as it stands, if it is meant to show that Humean rationality is particularly inimical to feminism. Nothing about the argument is specific to feminist political and moral commitments because it concerns the connections between judgments about justice in any area of social life and facts about social utility. Instead, it would seem that feminists, like all philosophers, could occupy either camp of the debate about the viability of Hume's theory.

Be that as it may, there seems to be something odd with the idea of measuring the success of general theories of rationality by how well they can support the truth of some specific substantive moral and political claims. Feminist commitments, even though widely shared in contemporary society, are not uncontroversial or immune from any possible criticism. Yet by assessing theories of rationality in terms of their ability to vindicate feminist claims, Heikes may seem to attribute precisely such an immunity to these claims. This is not, I think, what Heikes intends. Instead, she must think of feminism as a prior commitment which she brings to the evaluations of theories of rationality so that both prior commitment and theory are to be considered until some kind of reflective equilibrium is achieved. However, it must be added that it is not always clear that this is Heikes' intention.

Heikes describes her own positive view as occupying a middle way between the earliest feminist views according to which there is nothing wrong with the notion of reason and a different voice approach according to which women's stereotypical cognitive traits -- such as emotions -- must be taken into account in a more inclusive characterisation of reason. Heikes' middle way is based on arguing that early modern conceptions of rationality were mistaken in several ways. Further, these mistakes were detrimental to women. These mistaken conceptions need to be replaced with better conceptions. What makes these conceptions better is that they are more accurate theories of what reason amounts to. Further, since these theories include both emotions and perceptions as reasons, they are more sympathetic to feminist commitments.

One such theory is the virtue theory developed by Heikes in the final two chapters of this book. An advantage of the theory is its alleged ability to combine an acceptance of perspectivity with a commitment to the universality of reason. In particular the theory is intended to make it possible that some moral and political claims, such as those that are central to feminism, can be held as 'objectively and universally true' under some interpretation of these terms (pp. 150-1). Heikes fleshes out this commitment to the universality and objectivity of reason by adopting a neo-Aristotelian approach which she finds in Rebecca Kukla's work. This approach, which is reminiscent of John McDowell's meta-ethical views, takes there to be normative facts which can be perceived by those who have acquired by training and education the relevant set of cognitive abilities.

In this manner a virtue theory of rationality can make room for the contents of emotions and perceptions to figure among the reasons for claims. These emotions and perceptions, however, must themselves be the outcome of virtue in order to count as good reasons supporting the truth of a variety of normative claims. In my view, although there is much which is of interest in this approach to rationality, it is not clear that it can make sense of differences in perspective in any but a very superficial sense. Since reasons, as understood by this account, are universally binding there is no room for perspectives to make a difference with regard to what counts as a reason. Of course, as it happens different individuals will have access to different reasons; but this is a fact conceded by any account. Be that as it may, and despite my reservations about the brevity of some of the discussions in this book, there is no doubt that Heikes has produced a salutary antidote to the allure of relativism among some feminists and as such this book is to be welcomed.