Rationality and Moral Theory: How Intimacy Generates Reasons

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Diane Jeske, Rationality and Moral Theory: How Intimacy Generates Reasons, Routledge, 2008, 179pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415990363.

Reviewed by Simon Keller, University of Melbourne


Diane Jeske's book is subtitled "How Intimacy Generates Reasons," but its central thesis is that intimacy simply does generate reasons: no how or why about it. The book argues that we have reasons to show special concern for those with whom we share special relationships -- our friends, children, romantic partners, colleagues, and so on -- and that these "reasons of intimacy" are in every respect foundational; they are not derived from reasons of other kinds, they cannot be explained in terms of independent values or motives, and we know about them through direct, non-inferential intuition.

The basic claim -- that special relationships are themselves sources of fundamental moral reasons -- is not new. It is sometimes called "associativism" or "nonreductionism," and it has been defended by Samuel Scheffler, David Miller, Yael Tamir, Richard Rorty, Alasdair MacIntyre and Michael Sandel, among many others. (Jeske's argument for the claim is quite similar to Scheffler's.) Unlike all of these authors, however, Jeske does not present the view as a challenge to political liberalism. She argues that reasons of intimacy, while fundamental, arise only within relationships that are entered voluntarily, and hence denies the suggestion, which associativists usually endorse, that we have special obligations just by virtue of the relationships into which we happen to be born. Jeske also sets herself apart from most associativists by placing reasons of intimacy not within a communitarian story about the nature of morality, on which (some) moral truths are intimately linked with moral motivation, which is linked with moral identity, which is linked with particular relationships and communities, but instead within a metaethical framework that is unapologetically externalist, realist, nonnaturalist and intuitionist.

The book is clearly argued and attractively written, giving most of its arguments by way of clever, striking examples. Jeske presents a distinctive perspective on the morality of special relationships and its connection to questions in metaethics. Along the way, she also offers a helpful discussion of the ethics of promising, and a terrifically penetrating (if well hidden) examination of the purported deontological constraint against killing one innocent person to save several.

An undercurrent to the book is Jeske's temperamental relationship with "common sense," or the views of "plain men and women." In the early chapters, Jeske argues for a philosophical view by trying to show that only it can account for certain commonsensical judgments. In the later chapters, she argues against various commonsensical judgments by trying to show that they do not withstand philosophical scrutiny. There is a conflict, at least in spirit, between these two kinds of argument, and I think that the book illustrates the benefits and dangers of two quite different ways of doing moral philosophy.

In Chapter 1, Jeske introduces her realist, intuitionist metaethical picture and commits herself to the existence of two kinds of reasons: the subjective agent-relative and the objective agent-neutral. Your subjective agent-relative reasons are grounded in your own attitudes, and they apply to you but not to everyone; an example is your reason to eat a sandwich, if you want to eat a sandwich. Your objective agent-neutral reasons exist independently of your attitudes, and are shared by everyone; an example is your reason not to cause suffering. Chapter 2 argues that reasons of intimacy cannot be drawn within either of these two categories; they are agent-relative, but objective. If you are my friend, Jeske argues, then you have special reasons to treat me well: reasons that are shared by my other friends, but not by everyone, and that exist whether you desire me to do well or not.

Chapter 3 presents an account of friendship. It is intended to draw out the intuition that friendship does indeed generate special reasons, and to show that friendship has its own self-standing ethical life. Friendship, on Jeske's account, does not aim essentially at objective impersonal goods, and does not aim essentially at enhancing the virtue of the friends. Chapter 4 argues that "reasons of fidelity" -- reasons to keep promises -- constitute another kind of objective agent-relative reason. Such reasons, Jeske argues, cannot be satisfactorily explained in Kantian or consequentialist terms, or on T.M. Scanlon's "expectations" account. Like reasons of intimacy, she concludes, they must be fundamental. It might be thought that reasons of intimacy just are reasons of fidelity, so that your reasons to act well within a relationship stem from the promises you make on entering it, but Jeske rejects this reduction. She argues that (voluntarily) becoming a parent, for example, need not involve any explicit or implicit promise, and hence does not generate reasons of fidelity, but does generate reasons of intimacy.

Turning away from the ethics of special relationships, though sometimes using reasons of intimacy as examples, Chapters 5 and 6 confront objections to Jeske's realist intuitionism. Chapter 5 argues that intuitionists need not see the forming of a moral intuition as a dry intellectual process, but can instead accept a version of moral particularism, on which moral judgment involves emotion, and is appealingly "complicated and messy" (106). Chapter 6 seeks to demonstrate that intuitionist methods can yield moral progress. As an extended case study, Jeske considers the common judgment that it is (intrinsically) wrong to kill one innocent person to save several. She argues that this judgment is less sturdy than it first appears, and that standard deontological defenses of the judgment, represented by the arguments of Elizabeth Anderson and Fances Kamm, are not really defenses of it at all.

Chapter 7 turns at last to the defense of "voluntarism": the claim that you can only become subject to reasons of intimacy as a result of your voluntary actions. Voluntarism, Jeske admits, requires the rejection of some commonsense judgments, and indeed of judgments just like those appealed to in her earlier argument that reasons of intimacy are fundamental. It is probably a commonsense judgment that we have special obligations to our fellow citizens, and it is certainly a commonsense judgment that we have special obligations to our parents and siblings, but we do not choose our countries, parents or siblings, so these are judgments that the voluntarist must reject (or reduce). Jeske offers several resourceful arguments for voluntarism, one of which concludes that on many non-voluntarist views, "the evil things that others do to us generate special obligations for us" (139, Jeske's italics). The book ends with a two-page conclusion.

For a book so short, it covers a great deal of ground. It makes several varied contributions, and will be found controversial at several different points. The book as a whole, though, raises two large methodological issues. The first, which I will mention only briefly, concerns the links between metaethics, on the one hand, and normative and applied ethics, on the other. Jeske says that her normative claims and her metaethical claims "serve to reinforce each other" (2). I am not sure whether she means just that the views are consistent, or that you are more likely to believe one if you believe the other, or that one implies the other, or what. Where she has good normative arguments, though, they appear to have force independently of her commitments in metaethics. The second large methodological issue concerns, as I said above, the role granted to common sense.

Jeske is very confident in her claim that associativism, embedded in realist intuitionism, is the view of common sense, and that this is a powerful point in its favor. She refers to her view as "the commonsense account of reasons of intimacy" (14 and elsewhere), she says that "common sense demands that reasons of intimacy not be derivative" (63), and she suggests that only a philosophical motive, not felt by "plain men and women" (she is using W.D. Ross's language), could make us want reasons of intimacy to be anything other than fundamental (63-4).

Her claim to have common sense on her side is partly based on an argument by elimination: if other theories fail to respect certain common sense judgments, then only hers is left. But not all prevailing alternatives are eliminated. Jeske argues that our reasons of intimacy are not grounded in our (mere) desires, but does not ask whether they might be grounded in our more durable subjective states, like our plans, goals, needs, values or ways of understanding ourselves. She argues that our reasons of intimacy are not reasons directly to promote objective goodness, but she does not ask whether they might be reasons to respond to objective value in ways that do not involve maximization, or whether our reasons for acting well within special relationships might refer to objective values, even if our motives do not. This is difficult and well-trodden territory, and it could not all be dealt with in one book, but still -- more resources are available to Jeske's rivals than she acknowledges.

Further to the argument by elimination, Jeske suggests that her views can simply be read off common sense, if we examine it closely (29, 40-2, 63-4). Here, I think, she attributes more philosophical theory to common sense than it can plausibly be thought to contain. To give one relatively mild example, Jeske concludes, on the basis of some observations about everyday judgments and conversational habits, that common sense takes reasons of intimacy to be fundamental, not derivative. But the distinction between fundamental and derivative reasons is tricky and elusive. Different theorists understand it differently, and it is confusing even to many who have philosophical training. To divide reasons into the fundamental and the derivative, you need to go beyond the contents of common sense and do some philosophy.

The trouble, as I see it, stems from a failure adequately to distinguish the claim "This theory supports certain commonsensical judgments" from the claim "This theory is part of common sense." A theory may support certain judgments of common sense -- it may even be implied by such judgments -- while conflicting with other judgments of common sense, or while being, in its own right, strange and implausible. The insistence that her theory is commonsensical through and through, it seems to me, causes Jeske to disparage or overlook some concerns that deserve to be taken more seriously.

For example, Jeske is dismissive of the suggestion that realist intuitionism faces an epistemological objection, or that it requires us to possess extra-sensory "value detectors" with which we contact the realm of moral truths (25). Her scattered responses to the objection are too quick. She says that introspection is accepted as a perfectly good method of gaining knowledge about psychology (24). Yes, but it is one thing to learn about your mind by looking inwards, and another to learn about entities that are by nature mind-independent. She says that knowledge of moral facts is no stranger than knowledge of mathematical facts (72). Perhaps, but the epistemology of mathematics is not exactly uncontested, and anyway, there is something additionally odd about gaining knowledge not just of how things are, but of what you should do. She says that the material in Chapter 4 explains how we get moral knowledge through intuition (16, 25). But the chapter only argues that we intuitively take certain reasons to exist under certain conditions; it does not say how a faculty of intuition could get at moral truth, if not with the use of "value detectors." The assumption, it seems, is that if moral intuitions are part of common sense, then there must be nothing objectionable about intuitionism.

Jeske is even quicker with the suggestion that nonnatural reasons are ontologically troubling (28), and she does not consider a number of other concerns that I, at least, thought her view obviously to raise. It is odd to think that reasons of intimacy occupy their own autonomous ontological category, so that whether they are present within a particular relationship (with your hairdresser? your cousin?), or within a relationship at a particular time (first date? first kiss?), is an all-or-nothing matter. It is odd to think that special relationships, which make our lives better in so many different ways, should be governed by reasons that are in no way derived from facts about our needs or our characteristic sources of happiness and meaning.

None of this is to show that these views are false, or that she does not have good arguments for them. But in casting herself as a broadcaster of common sense, she becomes reluctant to admit that her views may have costs, or that they carry any surprising implications that need to be defended, and she comes under pressure to make common sense look more emphatic and more philosophically committed than it really is. (Also, as a reader, it is easy to become irritated by the intimation that you too would accept these philosophical views, if you would only set your common sense free.)

When Jeske turns against common sense in the last two chapters, the arguments become nimbler and more careful. Chapter 6 argues that the deontological constraint against killing the innocent is supported by nothing more than an intuition, and an unreliable intuition at that. Jeske makes a strong case for thinking that appeals to the notion of respect, or to anti-consequentialist conceptions of the value of human life, do no more than reassert the intuition. Chapter 7 defends voluntarism, and I think its main achievement is to give a more thorough explanation of why it is so hard reflectively to endorse the idea that we have involuntarily acquired special obligations (even if we intuitively ascribe such obligations all the time). Often, resistance to unchosen associative obligations is regarded as no more than a piece of liberal dogma; Jeske shows it to stem from much deeper moral concerns, which are not so easily dismissed.

In neither of the last two chapters does Jeske quite close the deal. In Chapter 6, she stops short of endorsing a consequentialist approach to the ethics of killing; she is content to say that she has made progress against various deontological positions, though I suspect that she would like her readers to conclude something stronger. In Chapter 7, she argues against the existence of fundamental obligations between siblings, and of children to parents, but does not give a verdict on our ordinary practices of assigning such obligations. Are we wrong to imagine that we have special obligations to our parents and siblings? If so, then perhaps we can equally well dismiss our intuitions about special obligations between friends, on which Jeske's earlier argument relies. Or can special obligations to parents and siblings be reduced to other, more fundamental obligations? If so, it would be interesting to hear the story about how, and to see whether it might be employed in a reductionist account of special obligations in general.

Nevertheless, I think that Jeske does better in the role of a respectful interrogator of common sense judgments. It leaves her less constrained by her interpretation of people's immediate opinions and ways of speaking, and more constrained by her arguments. But let me state again my view of the book as a whole: it is a strong, accessible, original contribution to the debate about the ethics of partiality, and it merits a great deal of attention.[1]

[1] Thanks to Neil Levy for helpful comments.