Rationality and the Good: Critical Essays on the Ethics and Epistemology of Robert Audi

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Mark Timmons, John Greco, and Alfred R. Mele (eds.), Rationality and the Good: Critical Essays on the Ethics and Epistemology of Robert Audi, Oxford University Press, 2007, 269pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0195326024.

Reviewed by Scott Sehon, Bowdoin College


Mark Timmons, John Greco, and Alfred R. Mele have put together an excellent collection of essays on the work of Robert Audi.  The volume arose from a 2005 conference on Audi at Notre Dame.  Since Audi has written on such a broad spectrum of philosophical issues, the collection is likewise wide-ranging in its scope.

The volume begins with a brief but useful overview from Audi, in which he describes his approach to epistemology and practical reason.  From there the essays are divided into three sections.  Part I contains six essays on Audi's intuitionist approach to ethics.  Part II comprises four essays on issues arising from Audi's epistemology, with questions raised about his foundationalism, his account of testimony, his epistemological internalism, and his claims about nondoxastic faith.  Part III turns to philosophy of action, with essays on intention and trying, self-deception, and motivating reasons for action.  In part IV, Audi offers sixty pages worth of replies to the essays.

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong begins part I with questions about the intuitions in Audi's moral intuitionism.  According to Audi, certain moral judgments are justified without inference from other beliefs.  These judgments are still defeasible, and it is possible that some of them could be justified inferentially, even if we in fact do not justify them that way, and Audi is adamant that the judgments do not need any inferential basis.  Nonetheless it is not the case that justified moral judgments are simply immediate gut reactions.  Rather, Audi says that moral judgments can be the product of reflection.  Sinnott-Armstrong struggles to understand Audi's distinction between conclusions of inference and conclusions of reflection.  Given a suitably wide sense of inference, some of Audi's examples of conclusions of reflection look a lot like inferences.  Sinnott-Armstrong ultimately suggests, tentatively, that conclusions of moral reflection must, contra Audi, ultimately be justified on the basis of inference.

Roger Crisp takes on a different aspect of Audi's intuitionism, namely Audi's claim that certain moral judgments are self-evident.  Crisp notes that there are deep moral disagreements about moral matters, and not only on basic normative principles but also about overarching philosophical theories (e.g., Kantianism, Utilitarianism, and virtue ethics).  He argues by appealing to what he calls Sidgwick's consensus condition:  Suppose that moral principle p seems self-evident to me, but that ~p seems self-evident to someone else; if I have no reason to think that the other person is less reflective, or understands p less well than I, then I don't have grounds for dismissing her rejection of p or her acceptance of ~p.  Thus, Crisp argues, it seems to turn out on Audi's view that moral justification is contingent on how others view things, and that might seem troublesome.

Hugh McCann offers his own version of intuitionism about ethics, one that he hopes is in the spirit of Audi's approach.  The key difference between him and Audi is that McCann thinks our awareness of the truth of moral judgments is not simply a cognitive matter.  He emphasizes the sense we often have of felt obligation, a sort of feeling that we must follow one course of action or another.  It is through this conative state that we come to recognize the moral features of action.  We still recognize our duties cognitively, but the cognitive recognition is indirect and is based on the conative feeling of obligation.  McCann believes that this approach helps in seeing how moral principles can be justified, and claims that Audi's purely cognitive approach threatens to make our belief in moral principles seem entirely dogmatic.

Audi's intuitionism is based on the work of W.D. Ross, who put forward a collection of fundamental moral principles that he thought were self-evident and noninferentially justified.  In his book, The Good in the Right, Audi revises this list and puts forward ten first order normative principles.  In Bernard Gert's contribution to the volume, Gert compares Audi's ten moral principles with the principles Gert himself has proposed.  He finds differences in how they are justified and in their underlying conceptions of morality.  For Gert, justification of moral principles requires showing "that all appropriately described rational persons would put forward the rules as public rules governing the behavior of all rational persons" (56), whereas Audi says he would "grant a kind of epistemic autonomy to Rossian moral principles" and thus claims that "neither their justification nor their interpretation depends on 'external' grounds in the way [Gert] supposes" (211).  Concerning the conception of morality, Gert argues that morality is about how you treat others, not yourself, so he would eliminate, at least as moral principles, those of Audi's that are self-directed.

An interesting feature of Audi's ethical view is that he thinks that one can ground Rossian intuitionism in features of Kantian moral theory (see chapter 3 of The Good in the Right).  Thomas Hurka likes Ross and likes Audi's version of intuitionism.  However, Hurka challenges Audi's attempt to ground this view in Kant, for Hurka thinks that Kant's ethical view is hopeless.  Hurka gives a brief sketch of a different sort of ethical view, which he calls Thomist, in which intrinsic values reside in states of affairs rather than (as with Kant) in persons.

Candace Vogler also questions Audi's marriage of Kant and Ross, though on different grounds.  She believes that Kant and Audi differ fundamentally concerning the place of principles in their accounts.  Vogler offers an interesting interpretation of Kant, according to which the categorical imperative in its various formulations does not express a moral principle in the relevant sense, namely as something that serves as a source of reasons and tells us what to do.  Rather the categorical imperative tells us something about the structure of duties and principles, in something like the way that the Pythagorean Theorem tells us something about the structure of triangles.  But the categorical imperative is not itself a moral principle any more than a2 + b2 = c2 is a triangle.  On her view, Audi's moral philosophy is very much concerned with moral principles, but Kant's is not.

Part II begins with an essay by Laurence Bonjour on foundationalism in epistemology.  Bonjour converted from coherentism to foundationalism and is thus in broadly the same epistemological camp as Audi.  Bonjour has agreed that some a priori beliefs and some introspective beliefs are foundational, but Bonjour had previously rejected Audi's view that perceptual beliefs could also be foundational.  In his contribution, Bonjour changes course and accepts perceptual beliefs as foundational, albeit not on Audi's grounds.  Bonjour defends the view that "our sensory experiences give us good reasons for our correlative beliefs about material objects because the existence of the objects in question provides the best explanation for the existence of such experiences" (94).

Next is Elizabeth Fricker, writing about knowledge gained from testimony.  She begins with the principle that "A hearer can acquire testimony-based knowledge from an attester only if the attester herself knows whereof she speaks" (100).  She and Audi both agree on the truth of this claim, but Fricker alleges that, given the nature of Audi's view, his allegiance to this principle is open to an objection raised by Jennifer Lackey, whereas Fricker's own epistemological view is immune to that objection.

Timothy Williamson takes on Audi's internalism about justification, according to which what justifies a belief must be something "to which one has access by introspection or reflection" (106).  I'll say more about this contribution below.

Audi's wide-ranging work has even encompassed the notion of faith, religious faith in particular, and this is the topic of William Alston's paper.  Audi claims that there is a psychological state of faith that is different from belief; Audi calls it nondoxastic faith.  As Alston explains, Audi takes nondoxastic faith to differ from belief in a number of ways, perhaps most significantly that it "requires less for justification or rationality than belief" (125).  Alston agrees with Audi that there is a state of faith that differs from belief, but he disagrees with Audi's characterizations of it.  After criticizing Audi's conception, he presents his own positive account of faith.

Part III comprises three articles under the heading, "Intention, Self-Deception, and Reasons for Action."  Frederick Adams leads off with an essay concerning the doxastic requirements of intention:  If I intend to Φ, must I firmly believe that I will Φ?  Neither Audi nor Adams answers affirmatively to this question.  Audi argues that I must at least believe that it is probable that I will Φ.  Adams argues against this view and urges instead that I must merely believe that it is possible that I will succeed in Φing.  Al Mele is next, and in his paper, Mele contrasts his view of self-deception with that of Audi and usefully explores connections between the notion of self-deception and the psychiatric concept of delusion.  Lastly, in "Motivating Reasons for Action," Raimo Tuomela discusses social, as opposed to merely individual, reasons for action.  He endeavors to extend Audi's account of individual reasons for action "to the case of social, especially joint, reasons."

The volume concludes with Audi's replies to each of the essays.  The replies are very useful, both in clarifying the issues and in pushing the debates forward.  Naturally, Audi does not simply capitulate to the claims made by the contributors.  In this brief review, I have not summarized Audi's replies, and I have withheld editorial comments on who gets the better of the arguments.  However, I did want to close with a little more detail on one of the debates between Audi and commentator.

As mentioned above, Timothy Williamson questions whether Audi's internalism about justification sits well with externalism about mental content.  Consider Oscar who lives on earth in 1750 and believes, reasonably enough, that there are pools of water around.  A counterfactual Twin Oscar lives in a world with XYZ, or twater, rather than water; Twin Oscar has a belief that he would express with the words "there are pools of water," but, according to the prevailing wisdom, Twin Oscar and Oscar have different beliefs.  Twin Oscar believes that there are pools of twater around.  Both Oscars are presumably justified in holding their respective beliefs.  But since the Oscars are identical, it seems that, on epistemological internalism, anything that Twin Oscar is justified in believing, Oscar is justified in believing as well, and this leads to absurd results.  Laying this out with pedantic explicitness (blame me for this presentation, not Williamson), I take it that the basic argument starts like this:

(1)  If Audi's epistemological internalism is correct, then internally identical duplicates would be justified in believing the same things.  [Premise]

(2)  Oscar and Twin Oscar are internally identical duplicates.  [Premise]

(3)  Twin Oscar is justified in believing that there are pools of twater around.  [Premise]

(4)  If Audi's epistemological internalism is correct, then Oscar would be justified in believing that there are pools of twater around.  [1,2,3]

But the consequent of step (4) seems wrong.  Oscar has never seen XYZ/twater in his life, nor has anyone he has ever talked to.  Why would he be justified in (falsely) believing that there are pools of twater around?  Moreover, as Williamson points out, twin earth cases could be multiplied at will, and the argument could be run as many times as necessary to show that Oscar is fully justified in believing all sorts of odd things.  Surely something has gone wrong, and it seems that epistemological internalism is the culprit.  So, to eke out the rest of the argument in numbered steps:

(5)  Oscar would not in fact be justified in believing that there are pools of twater around.  [Premise]

(6)  Audi's epistemological internalism is incorrect.  [4,5]

I find Audi's response to this argument hard to make out.  For starters, Audi's discussion changes the example from "there are pools of water around" to "water is refreshing," and he takes the latter belief to be objectual, i.e., a de re ascription of a property to water.  Audi goes on to answer Williamson's argument as if it is about objectual or de re beliefs.  Audi writes:

My position is that the Oscars need not differ in what they believe about the liquid in question; they do differ in their objectual beliefs; and they need not differ in the kinds of accessible elements that serve as justifying grounds, which will be internal in any case.  The crucial point for my epistemology is that what justifies be internally accessible, not that people with equivalent justificatory resources need have the same beliefs -- nor, as we have seen, is there only kind of belief in question.  (237)

If the original argument were about objectual beliefs, Audi's reply seems to be this:  Oscar's grounds for believing that water is refreshing are the same as Twin Oscar's grounds for believing that twater is refreshing.  I.e., both twins have the same grounds for ascribing the property of being refreshing to the substance of which they speak.  But the twins are ascribing the same properties to different things.  Since Oscar is not in contact with twater, he has no reason to have any beliefs about it at all; so the fact that Twin Oscar is justified in believing something of twater does not make it the case that Oscar is justified in having the same belief.  Thus, we cannot say, as perhaps Audi thinks Williamson was saying, that Oscar would be justified in having a bunch of objectual beliefs about twater.

But, as near as I can tell, Williamson's argument never claimed any such thing.  Williamson's example was the belief that "there are pools of water around," which is essentially an existence claim, rather than a de re ascription of a property to a substance.  The situation seems fairly simple.  Twin Oscar is amply justified in believing that twater exists in abundance.  Given epistemological internalism, Oscar is in an identical epistemological situation, and thus is likewise justified in believing that twater exists in abundance.  But that seems silly.  Where exactly does Audi say that this argument goes wrong?  Audi provides an interesting and useful discussion of narrow and wide content, and of de re and de dicto beliefs; but I am left confused about which specific step in Williamson's argument he can deny.

Questions of argumentative detail aside, this volume will be most useful to those who closely follow Audi's work; but it should be of general interest as well.  It ranges over a broad set of topics and contains much high quality philosophical work from a distinguished set of contributors.