Rawls, Dewey and Constructivism: On the Epistemology of Justice

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Eric Thomas Weber, Rawls, Dewey and Constructivism: On the Epistemology of Justice, Continuum, 2010, 168pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441161147.

Reviewed by Tom Rockmore, Duquesne University


Eric Thomas Weber's excellent book raises a constructivist challenge against Rawls's constructivism. Constructivism comes into modern philosophy through Hobbes, Vico and Kant. Kant introduces epistemological constructivism as an alternative epistemological strategy after the failure of representationalism. His Copernican insight that we can only claim to know what we in some sense construct is later revised by others as the claim that subject and object are both constructed in a historical space. The many modern constructivists include all the post-Kantian German idealists, American pragmatists such as Peirce and Dewey, and so on.

The term "constructivism" does not appear in Rawls's A Theory of Justice. It only emerges in later publications such as "Themes in Kant's Moral Philosophy"[1] and "Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory."[2] According to Rawls, who links his view to Kant's, "Kantian constructivism holds that moral objectivity is to be understood in terms of a suitably constructed social point of view that all can accept."[3] Yet he never specifies his understanding of Kantian constructivism or explains how his own view relates to Kant's.

Rawls' constructivism has been discussed and criticized in the debate.[4] Onora O'Neill, for instance, objects to what she describes as Rawlsian constructivism as an uneasy balancing between relativizing and idealizing in constructing a position that is "neither realist nor relativist."[5] In his short, tightly-argued book, Weber further develops the constructivist criticism of Rawls in creatively comparing and contrasting the views of Rawls and Dewey. The result is a Deweyan critique of Rawls centering on a creative use of the epistemological distinction in Kant's critical philosophy between representationalism and constructivism. Though Rawls says little directly about constructivism, Weber rightly regards this underdeveloped strand of his position as important and criticizes it accordingly. Weber's approach centers on Rawls's A Theory of Justice while taking into account his other writings as well as many items in the already large and steadily increasing discussion.

The link between Rawls and Dewey lies in their respective links to Kant. Weber constantly points to the Kantian element in Rawls, which he just as constantly criticizes through Dewey's critical reaction to Kant. Weber thinks that the Kantian tension between representationalism and constructivism further applies to Rawls. Throughout, Weber takes Dewey as affording a richer understanding of a constructivist model. Weber shows that Rawls' version of social contract theory depends on insufficiently examined presuppositions. He further shows the closeness of Rawls to Kant. Through remarks on Dewey, Weber also shows the interest of constructivism as a methodological approach.

The book contains an introduction (chapter 1) and five additional chapters. The introduction points out that long before Rawls Dewey argued that we must consider individuals in a social context. Weber suggests that many of the differences between Rawls and Dewey derive from Rawls's closeness to Kant, hence his dependence on the Kantian dichotomy between relativism and constructivism. According to Weber, social contract theorists like Rawls are impeded or prevented from formulating a robust constructivist account, hence they continue to rely on representationalism. Weber, who takes Dewey as his constructivist standard, objects to Rawls's quasi-Kantian inability to choose between constructivism and representationalism.

Chapter 2, which is entitled "Social Contract Theory Old and New", responds to Rawls's conviction that his version of social contract theory is immune to ordinary criticism. Weber answers that it cannot respond to objections based on Hume, Hegel, Dewey and others. For Kant, the consent in the original contract must derive from reason. Weber thinks that Rawls incorporates both utilitarian and deontological concerns. Like Kant he bases his conception of justice on the categorical imperative. Kant relies on reason to justify consent, but Rawls relies on legitimacy. Rawls, who associates his view of justice as fairness with H. L. A. Hart's view of natural law, asks what people could agree to in fair circumstances. But Kant asks what they could possibly agree to.

According to Weber, a Humean critique of social contract theory would call attention to the historical element. Hegel's critique of social contract theory similarly favors a view of human being as a historical creation. This amounts to denying that we can draw hard distinctions between relevant and irrelevant aspects of personhood. Deweyan criticisms of social contract theory reject property as its basis, point to the difficulty of its abstract starting point, further point to the need to avoid either absolutism or atomism, and finally reject static individualism. Weber concludes that Rawls fails to address a number of important criticisms of social contract theory.

The third chapter, which is entitled "Worlds Apart: On Moral Realism and Two Constructivisms," begins from the incompatibility of constructivism and realism. Weber, who follows constructivists in rejecting (David Brink's version of) moral realism, criticizes Rawls as inconsistent:

The trouble with Rawls's approach is that he claims to take the path of constructivism, but he hopes to preserve the rigidity of conceptual requirements, or necessary conditions that are more common with representationalism. In other words, like Kant, Rawls wants both sides of the dilemma (p. 47).

Rawls's version of constructivism is half-hearted, a sort of constructivism light as it were. At stake in the choice between constructivism and representationalism is whether we begin by studying how we form our ideas when real cases arise or whether we concentrate on hypothetical cases.

Chapter 4, entitled "Freedom and Phenomenal Persons," considers the same dilemma with respect to the human subject. According to Weber, Rawls is simultaneously committed to constructivism as well as to a Kantian philosophy of (noumenal) freedom. Dewey rejects the noumenal self since only real people can be held responsible. In his anti-Kantian view, freedom is not a prerequisite to moral action but rather acquired through education. For Dewey, subject (and objects) are both constituted in experience. As Weber reads Rawls, the latter is committed to a Kantian view of freedom at odds with his constructivism, for instance in taking the concept of right as prior to the unity of the self. Rawls's ideal observer approach to constructivism in the original position is similar to a noumenal viewpoint on the world. Weber points out the contrast between Rawls's ahistorical atomism and a more historical view of the subject in the social context. Rawls ignores the implications of constructivism for personhood.

The fifth chapter considers "Rawls' Epistemological Tension: The Original Position, Reflective Equilibrium, and Objectivity." Rawls believes that his theories will lead to so-called singular or objective results. He arrives at his principles in two ways: through a general choice of a social contract approach and through his conception of reflective equilibrium. Both are fraught with the dilemma in question. Social contract theory harbors a tension between representationalism, say in the concern to arrive at moral judgments independent of people, and constructivism. Weber prefers Dewey's concern to take into account the historical dimension of human being. A Deweyan constructivist would approach objectivity as something one must confront, not as something independent of us, hence not as something to be discovered, uncovered as revealed as it is.

Chapter 6 studies the theme of "Dewey and Rawls on Education" in extrapolating what Rawls could say on the basis of his position. In virtue of his atomistic approach, Rawls is unconcerned with the way we are rooted in a particular society at a particular time. His underdeveloped constructivism remains in tension with representationalism:

The tension we see in Rawls's work between representationalism and constructivism leads to a political theory that abandons the project of preparing citizens in a robust way for the various challenges that can only be overcome through intelligent, cooperative, social action. For this reason, it is best to follow Dewey in adopting a more through-going constructivism and the consequent democratic educational theory that he pioneered (p. 138).

I will conclude with two points. Kant is not easy to interpret. Weber's Deweyan critique of Rawls's constructivist conception of justice points to the difficulty in grasping Kantian constructivism. In Rawls's writings, the reference to Kantian constructivism is so vague as to be essentially meaningless. That is one of the implications of this very useful book.

Weber, who takes Dewey to be a better constructivist than Rawls, is also taking aim at Kant, Rawls's model, who also hesitates between representationalism and constructivism. In the critical philosophy, the object is constructed but the subject, which is not constructed, is supra-historical, hence not in context. Weber's objection to Rawls's conception of the subject points beyond him to the Kantian transcendental subject. For Hegel, both the subject and the object are constructed, hence historical. This is a point that Dewey, who comes out of the American Hegelian tradition, has in common with Hegel. In taking Dewey as his criterion, and though he does not say as much in a book that has few direct references to Hegel, Weber is taking Hegel as a model as well.

[1] Kant's Transcendental Deductions: The Three Critiques and the Opus postumum, edited by Eckart Förster, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1989, pp. 81-113.

[2] Journal of Philosophy, September 1980, 77 (9), pp. 515-572. Reprinted in John Rawls, Collected Papers, ed. Samuel Freeman, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999, pp. 303-358.

[3] See Rawls, Collected Papers, p. 307.

[4] See William Galston, "Moral Personality and Liberal Theory: John Rawls' Dewey Lectures," in Political Theory, vol. 10, no. 4, November 1982, pp. 4891-519; see also Onora O'Neill, "Constructivism in Kant and Rawls," in The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, edited by Samuel Freeman, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2003, pp. 347-367.

[5] Onora O'Neill, Constructions of Reason: Explorations of Kant's Practical Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1989, p. 206.