Rawls, Political Liberalism and Reasonable Faith

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Paul Weithman, Rawls, Political Liberalism and Reasonable Faith, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 255pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107147430.

Reviewed by David A. Reidy, University of Tennessee


Paul Weithman is among the very best of Rawls's expositors and critics. This volume collects nine previously published essays, the earliest from the mid-1990s, and a previously unpublished one. They are unified by a concern with Rawls's argument for the inherent stability of justice as fairness, an argument set out initially in A Theory of Justice and then revised in Political Liberalism and The Law of Peoples, and with the moral psychology and political sociology upon which it rests. They cast considerable light on Rawls's project and serve as a nice complement and/or introduction to Weithman's more detailed and sustained study in Why Political Liberalism? The previously published essays appeared in a wide range of journals and edited collections. Their collection here will serve interested readers who initially missed some or all of them. Weithman's characteristic interpretive charity, analytic rigor and reasonableness with respect to competing values are on full display throughout. In several essays, these virtues are displayed in the context of profitable engagement with interlocutors and audiences (e.g., those who publish in and read the Journal of Religious Ethics or who work in political theology) too often ignored by other political philosophers.

The essays range widely over Rawls's corpus, from his undergraduate thesis to The Law of Peoples. Though aimed mainly at explaining and defending Rawls in response to influential contributions to the secondary literature (e.g., Richard Rorty, Jean Hampton, Gerald Gaus, Bernard Williams.), they are not devoid of criticism of and proposed revisions to Rawls's views. But these, constructive and friendly, are ventured only late in a shared journey.

The first essay argues for the scholarly significance of Rawls's undergraduate thesis. Weithman does not locate this in the theological accounts of personality and community, or of sin and grace, that Rawls develops there (though he doesn't deny their significance). He finds its significance rather in, first, Rawls's critique of a certain allegedly impoverished picture (which the undergraduate Rawls dubs "naturalist" and finds running through much Christian thought) of human nature and of the structure of desire in particular; and, second, in Rawls's offering to his reader a richer alternative picture and with it the possibility of a revised self-understanding. Weithman argues persuasively that in these regards the undergraduate thesis prefigures both Theory's critique of and presentation of an alternative picture to the allegedly impoverished moral psychology Rawls associates with teleological and especially dominant end moral theories. Weithman makes a compelling case that from his undergraduate days forward Rawls experienced and understood human nature in terms that included a basic desire for a certain sort of self-actualizing relational activity that is ongoing, open-ended and inherently pluralistic, a desire for the adverbial sense of personality and community, or, in the later work, of citizenship and polity.

Unfortunately, Weithman does not discuss Rawls's view in the undergraduate thesis of the origin of this desire, which seems to me also to have some scholarly significance. This desire, while consistent with and involving both nature and reason, is produced by neither alone, nor by their combination. Rather, it depends in part on a certain sort of contingent experience of personality and community (a record of which he suggests is contained in the Bible) that individuals receive as a matter of grace. This prefigures a theme central to Rawls's mature work. There he maintains that the "conception dependent" desire to self-actualize as the relational activity of either personality/community or citizen/polity, though consistent with and involving both nature and reason, is produced by neither alone, nor by their combination. Rather, it depends in part on a certain sort of contingent experience within the affective, developmental and historical dynamics of social life. The mature Rawls may have abandoned the traditional Christian doctrines of original sin and grace, but as with Rousseau and Hegel he draws on more than a simple, or, perhaps better, on more than a simplistic understanding of nature and reason to fill out an alternative but still hopeful picture of our redemptive self-actualization. I suspect I am not the only reader who would have liked to have had Weithman's view on this, especially given its relevance to his discussion in the final essay of the sense in which justice as fairness has a religious aspect.

Weithman's second essay situates Rawls's post-graduate turn to political philosophy in a deeply felt need after World War II to vindicate a reasonable faith in liberal democracy. He correctly argues that Rawls's initial central concern was not to determine principles of justice (Rawls affirmed liberal views widely shared in the mid-1950s and early 1960s) but rather to establish the inherent stability of familiar liberal democratic principles of justice. Both the Millian utilitarian and the intuitionistic natural rights traditions could deliver, at least in certain articulations, familiar liberal democratic principles of justice. But neither offered a moral psychology or political sociology sufficient to underwrite for those committed to such principles a reasonable and shared faith in the inherent stability of shared political activity oriented by and faithful to them. Citizens, and so officials, might be saddled with a reasonable doubt that the shared political activity they took to be liberal democracy either was or could at any time easily become, even without their knowing it, counterfeit. If so, they would, Rawls saw, hedge their bets and withhold the sort of full-hearted commitment to liberal democracy and to one another that WWII had shown necessary if liberal democracy was to survive over the long haul. Indeed, Rawls suspected that it was on the rocky shoals of such doubts that Weimar Germany had capsized, clearing a path to its descent into Nazism.

Weithman here makes a substantial down payment on the claim that Rawls's work was fundamentally oriented by a concern with inherent stability (and so with moral psychology and political sociology) from beginning to end. But he might have done more. Rawls's post-graduate turn to political philosophy was also responsive to a worry that the politics of racial justice, given additional life by Truman's desegregating the military and by Brown v. Board of Education, required a degree of political trust that neither utilitarian nor intuitionistic natural rights theories seemed well-equipped to underwrite. Of course, a concern with the inherent stability of liberal democracy was not the only reason Rawls turned from moral to political philosophy. Shortly after completing his dissertation he realized that for it to deliver on the promise that explicating "considered moral judgments" would illuminate human nature he had to be able objectively to validate the "favorable background conditions" presupposed by those judgments. As a methodological matter, within a scientific approach to the normative, the political was prior to the moral.

The third essay takes up various objections, voiced mainly after the publication of Political Liberalism, that Rawls "privatizes" religion, wrongly excluding it from public political discourse and doing so largely out of a misplaced fear that including it would prove divisive. Weithman argues that Rawls "privatizes" religion neither in the manner nor to the degree that his critics suggest and that his treatment of it is driven not by a misplaced fear that it is socially divisive but rather by a sensible desire to arrive publicly at a reasonable balance, under modern conditions, of various values internal to liberal democracy. Not least among these values are mutual political respect, civility, and civic friendship; religious liberty and community; and mutual assurance and inherent political stability. If Rawls's critics are committed to liberal democracy, Weithman concludes, they must either offer a more attractive balancing of these values or show that being committed to liberal democracy does not entail being committed to all of them. Here he makes a point Rawls himself often made: in practical matters it is often easy but typically unproductive to criticize without offering an alternative, and when faced with competing values the sensible thing to do is to try first to find a reasonable way to accommodate them all.

The fourth essay addresses Rawls's so-called "political turn" and in particular those who characterize it as a retreat from the traditional search for the truth and metaphysical foundations of justice to a pragmatic search for consensus under conditions of modernity. Weithman correctly notes that from his early graduate student work through both Theory and his subsequent "political turn," Rawls thought of his work as proceeding along two dimensions. The first, to which he devoted most of his effort, involved comparing and drawing out the features, including those related to inherent stability, of competing explications of various domains of considered moral judgments. This was work (Rawls dubbed it moral and political theory) with respect to which the philosopher might make especially valuable contributions. The second involved discovering which if any such explication might in fact reliably draw the freely given allegiance of intelligent persons of good will. This was work (Weithman dubs it public philosophy) to be undertaken within social life by all intelligent persons of good will and with respect to which the philosopher has no especially valuable contribution to make. Rawls engaged in it as just one of the many intelligent persons of good will whose freely given allegiance a public philosophy was to take account of. Weithman concludes that characterizing Rawls's so-called "political turn" as a retreat from a search for the truth and metaphysical foundations of justice in favor of a pragmatic search for consensus under conditions of modernity appears plausible only if one fails to understand the nature of his work. This is surely correct, but it would have been useful here also, I think, to have made explicit that Rawls never spoke in terms of the "truth" of moral principles or political conceptions because he was, from the beginning, in the practical business of intelligently and self-reflectively fashioning them as a reasonable means to a reasonable end. Their "truth" was simply not central to his concern.

The fifth essay addresses what Weithman calls the "standard reading" of Political Liberalism. On this reading, in the years following Theory Rawls recognized that under conditions of freedom reasonable disagreement would range over not only individuals' conceptions of their own good (i.e., life plans) but also comprehensive doctrinal conceptions of self and world and so of the good generally as well as conceptions of justice. Rawls thus concluded, on this reading, that the hope articulated in Theory for a society well-ordered by justice as fairness was in fact unreasonable and unrealistic. Citizens would remain forever reasonably divided over which was the best justified conception of justice. So he set out in Political Liberalism, the argument goes, to show that it was still reasonable and realistic to think that under conditions of freedom they would converge on the family of generically liberal political conceptions of justice and on the liberal principle of legitimacy as publicly justified. These then framed a suitably trimmed-back picture of a "well-ordered" liberal democracy that was still within reach. Acknowledging that this "standard reading" is not without support, Weithman properly resists it on the ground that it obscures what was central to Rawls's transition to Political Liberalism.

This, Weithman argues, was not the prospect of reasonable disagreement over conceptions of justice. It was instead the prospect of citizens finding themselves drawn to comprehensive doctrinal understandings so diverse that they would have no shared public basis for thinking that having and acting on their socially cultivated sense of justice, even if it was uniformly captured and expressed by justice as fairness, was fully congruent, for each and all of them, with their good. Lacking a shared public basis for so thinking, citizens would find themselves drawn rationally to hedge their bets when it comes to trusting one another in political life. The inherent stability of justice as fairness that Rawls thought he had established in Part III of Theory was thus undone. Political Liberalism constitutes Rawls's attempt to reestablish it on alternative grounds. It is not fundamentally a retreat to a suitably trimmed political aspiration or ideal centered on the family of generically liberal political conceptions of justice and the liberal principle of legitimacy as the most that might be publicly justified under conditions of freedom.

To be sure, the family of generically liberal political conceptions of justice and the liberal principle of legitimacy figure centrally in Political Liberalism. But their role is to give content to a weighty political value, peaceful democratic governance subject to political right, to which reasonable citizens might appeal as a public basis for their mutually assuring one another of congruence between their shared political activity, on the one hand, and their diverse comprehensive doctrinal self-understandings, on the other. Rawls's claim is that citizens able publicly to assure one another of congruence in this sense would be able to maintain political trust in one another at least to a degree sufficient to their sustaining a peaceful constitutional and generically liberal and democratic regime. Of course, within any such regime citizens might over time come to settle on justice as fairness as their democratically (though perhaps never unanimously) preferred and legitimately enacted conception of justice. There is nothing unreasonable or unrealistic about such an aspiration or political ideal, provided one allows that reasonable political disagreement and thus legitimate democratic departures from justice as fairness in favor of other liberal political conceptions of justice will remain always a real possibility.

The sixth and seventh essays pick up where the fifth leaves off, linking democratic governance, and in particular the ideal of public reason and the liberal principle of legitimacy, with what Weithman dubs the "role-specified duties" of citizenship. Accepting for the sake of argument (with one small modification: public reasons must be ready to hand only when political trust is in fact in jeopardy) Rawls's ideal theory account of public reason, Weithman argues that this "wide view" is nevertheless not the best non-ideal theory account for citizens today in the United States, at least with respect to their political relations to one another simply as citizens (and not as elected or appointed officials). He agrees with Rawls that citizens must always be prepared to explain and justify their positions on constitutional essentials and basic justice by reference to their political common good as free and equal citizens. But he argues that under non-ideal theory conditions this political common good need not be, nor need be presented as, freestanding from comprehensive doctrinal commitments. What citizens reasonably expect of one another under non-ideal theory conditions is that they use the power of their political office to advance their political common good as free and equal citizens. Political respect and trust between them requires no more. Martin Luther King Jr. need not have had, or have been prepared to provide, freestanding public reasons for his political positions regarding civil rights and the injustices of racism. No reasonable citizen, not even a nonreligious citizen, could reasonably doubt his commitment to using the power of his office as citizen to advance their political common good as free equals. Indeed, this was, for reasonable citizens, manifestly enough to sustain mutual respect and trust.

From this Weithman concludes that under non-ideal theory conditions what citizens reasonably expect is that politically they together have the final word with respect to the political power they wield over one another and that they wield it always for the sake of their political common good as free and equal citizens. They do not reasonably expect that they each be ready and able publicly to justify exercises of their political power solely in terms of doctrinally freestanding public reasons, as if citizenship itself was not only the form but also the source of the authority they wield over one another. Indeed, under non-ideal theory conditions reasonable citizens may reasonably suspect that doctrinally free-standing public reasons, the normative force of which derives from citizenship as such, will prove incapable by themselves of guiding them to justice (not to mention other weighty political goods).

In the eighth essay, Weithman undertakes to distance himself from the so-called "convergence" views of public reason to which his own view, more permissive in both ideal and non-ideal theory than some followers of Rawls might prefer, might seem to tend. He argues that convergence theorists (Gaus, et al.) misunderstand political autonomy, incorrectly contrasting it with being forced to submit to the judgment of others. Political autonomy is correctly contrasted with political heteronomy, which may but need not involve being forced to submit to the judgment of others. Even if she freely submits to a law, a person lacks political autonomy if the justifying reasons for it do not concern the political common good she shares with fellow citizens. Further, political autonomy, so understood, is a condition of autonomy more generally. Even if she freely submits to a specific life plan or doctrinal self-understanding, a person lacks autonomy more generally if she comes to it against background conditions given by a system of laws for which there are no justifying reasons rooted in the political common good she shares with her fellow citizens. Convergence theorists seem not to grasp these points. Of course, grasping them is consistent with recognizing, as Weithman does, that political ideals, such as political autonomy, must often be balanced against other values, such as religious liberty, and that under non-ideal theory conditions they must often be realized by degree. It is this recognition that leads Weithman to his own views on public reason, more permissive than some Rawlsians might prefer, not any deep theoretical sympathy with convergence theorists. Indeed, Weithman suggests that what is probably most deeply at stake in the debates between Rawlsians and convergence theorists is the ideal of inherent stability, or stability for the right reasons, itself.

Weithman closes with two essays that return to the relationship between Rawls's thinking more generally and Christian religion. The ninth essay argues against those who read Rawls's The Law of Peoples as a retreat from the allegedly cosmopolitan liberal democratic ambitions of Theory, driven by a tacit Christian Realist recognition of the fallen and forever too self-interested nature of humankind. Weithman argues that The Law of Peoples is better read as expressing Rawls's sense of the very modest state, won over only the last two centuries, of our current knowledge regarding the relationship between liberal democratic political institutions, the moral sentiments they engender, and social stability. We are still learning about liberal democracy in the domestic case. We simply do not yet know enough to be able to assess, let alone mount an argument for, the inherent stability of a liberal democratic cosmopolitan world order. We might secure this knowledge over time. But for now the priority must be on sustaining and improving our domestic liberal democratic projects and incrementally and peacefully realizing within the international order institutions that allow for the free political self-development of all peoples subject to international right. As we realize these institutions and as the world's peoples develop we will learn more about what at the international level may be realistically inherently stable and thus what we might reasonably hope for. On Weithman's account, then, Rawls's position in The Law of Peoples reflects his recognition that our ability practically to set, understand and pursue political ends is something that we develop and perfect within history over time and by degree, and his humility with respect to where we stand in that process.

The final essay argues that justice as fairness is a religious view in a manner analogous to the way in which Kant's moral theory is a religious view: each expresses a conception of the world as a whole such that it is, as a self-sufficient system of final ends, worthy of devotion or reverence in the sense of functioning within our inner life as supremely regulative of practical reason. The essay sheds substantial light on Rawls's remark to the effect that if it is not reasonable to hope for a world hospitable to a just and stable liberal democracy, then it is unclear what point is served by human beings walking the Earth.

I want to register briefly a few final comments. First, I would have appreciated a more careful distinguishing in these essays between well-orderedness and inherent stability. This is especially important for understanding The Law of Peoples. There Rawls argues that a well-ordered people need not be liberal and democratic, but he neither argues nor suggests that all well-ordered peoples are inherently stable. Second, because stability is a property of equilibria, I think the discussions of reasonable disagreement and pluralism would have profited from their being situated within the framework of wide and general reflective equilibrium. Part III of Theory argued for the inherent stability of a certain sort of equilibrium; Political Liberalism argues for the inherent stability of a certain pattern of equilibria. Finally, with respect to both the inherent stability of a generically liberal constitutional democracy under ideal theory conditions and the struggle for justice within extant liberal democracies under non-ideal theory conditions, I wish Weithman had included more discussion of the relationship between inherent stability, the moral psychology of reciprocity, the social bases of self-respect, amour propre and the strains of political commitment. As I suspect he would acknowledge and as his brief mentions of MLK Jr., suggest, the social pathologies that most plague us today stem not from failures of mutual assurance in political life but from a citizenry in the grip of an institutionally engendered moral psychology of pride and shame.