Rawls's A Theory of Justice: An Introduction

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Jon Mandle, Rawls's A Theory of Justice: An Introduction, Cambridge UP, 2009, 211pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521646673.

Reviewed by Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, University of Århus, Denmark



Cambridge Introductions to Key Philosophical Texts offer ‘introductory textbooks on what are considered to be the most important texts of Western Philosophy’. This one introduces a book that has undoubtedly been extremely important over the last forty years: John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (henceforth TJ). As one of Rawls’ critics, Robert Nozick, wrote in 1974: ‘Political philosophers now must either work within Rawls’ theory or explain why not’.1 Jon Mandle is surely right that this remains as true now as it was in 1974.

In accordance with the aim of the series, the basic tone of the book is expository. Often, however, the exposition is broken off to sketch briefly and then reject interpretations of Rawls’ position that Mandle finds exegetically and otherwise unsatisfactory. Mandle pays particular attention to showing why TJ should not be read as an early luck-egalitarian work and why it is not a defense of welfare-state capitalism. He is basically sympathetic to the project in TJ and sees his task as one of rescuing ‘its core from misinterpretation and misguided criticisms’ (p. 34).

Mandle’s book is divided into four main parts. The first part offers a brief sketch of Rawls’ life and truly remarkable personality, his pre-TJ work, an overview of the main arguments and principles of TJ, and a critical review of two influential, but according to Mandle, misguided interpretations of TJ: first, that Rawls rejects the notion of desert altogether and, second, that Rawls holds the luck-egalitarian belief that ‘all inequalities that are arbitrary — those who are nobody’s fault — are presumptively unjust’ (p. 24). Mandle does a good job showing why crucial elements in Rawls’ position are incompatible with luck-egalitarianism — e.g., the difference principle appears to permit inequalities that reflect arbitrary differences in people’s talents - and why some passages normally offered in support of a luck-egalitarian interpretation of Rawls should be read differently. However, a suspicion lingers on. Luck-egalitarianism was clearly articulated as a position only after TJ was published and, accordingly, one might presume that TJ’s relation to luck-egalitarianism may not be as clear-cut as one would have liked it to be forty years later. Some passages in TJ seem quite open to a luck-egalitarian interpretation and some do not, and, accordingly, any attempt to impose a uniform interpretation on TJ will clash with some passages in TJ or with what these passages commit Rawls to. For instance, it seems that the part of the intuitive argument for the difference principle that invokes considerations about moral arbitrariness fits quite well within a luck-egalitarian framework. Mandle seems to recognize this much when he feels the need to write that this argument is ‘not found in [Rawls’] published lectures on justice as fairness’ (p. 27) and is not Rawls’ ‘official’ argument for the difference principle (whatever ‘official’ means here - offhand, it would seem that if one provides an unofficial argument for something, it does not mean that one does not in fact endorse the argument).

The second part consists of three chapters, each of which corresponds to a part of TJ and comes in the same chronological order as the corresponding parts in TJ. Chapter 2 introduces the main and most well-known components of Rawls’ theory of justice as fairness: the two principles of justice, the way in which justice as fairness differs from intuitionism as well as utilitarianism, reflective equilibrium, primary goods, the veil of ignorance, and the original position. One noticeable interpretative claim is that Rawls’ argument for the difference principle makes no appeal to the maximin principle for choice under uncertainty (p. 65).

Chapter 3 expounds Rawls’ discussion of which institutions may satisfy his two principles of justice. Part of the motivation for this discussion is that we cannot be justified in accepting Rawls’ two principles of justice unless we can see how these can be realized through an attractive institutional scheme (p. 75). According to Mandle’s Rawls, several sets of institutions may do so. However, some institutions do it better than others and, unlike the dominant view, Rawls thinks that a property-owning democracy can be expected to do so better than traditional welfare-state models of capitalism because the former better secures ‘the fair value of political liberties and fair equality of opportunity’ (p. 89).

Chapter 4 explains Rawls’ account of why a society that satisfies his principles of justice may be stable for the right reasons. Essential here is that citizens’ sense of justice can be congruent with their ‘other values and goals’ (p. 109); crucial to ensuring this is Rawls’ claim that ‘the collective activity of justice is the preeminent form of human flourishing’ (p. 130).2 This part of Rawls’ theory of justice, like the ground covered in Chapter 3, normally receives less attention in standard commentaries than it does in Mandle’s book, and this neglect might not have been justified on Rawls’ understanding of the significance of his own work. Mandle quotes Freeman as reporting that Rawls himself thought his argument for congruence was his most original contribution in TJ and was puzzled that it did not attract more attention (p. 142). Since, as Mandle stresses, the difference principle is only one component in Rawls’ full theory of justice, and even one that is lexically subordinated to the other components, this more proportionate (page-number-wise) attention to different parts of TJ is a welcome distinctive feature of the book.

The third part of Mandle’s book relates TJ to some of Rawls’ later works, notably Political Liberalism, and his idea about a reasonable consensus between overlapping views and the political conception of a moral person. Basically, Mandle thinks that the distance between TJ and Rawls’ later works is smaller than it is normally assumed to be and that any identifiable differences are due, mostly, to Rawls’ ‘ultimate dissatisfaction’ (p. 142) with his congruence argument (apparently in slight tension with his abovementioned reported puzzlement over readers’ focus).

In the last chapter, Mandle addresses a handful of criticisms of Rawls: various criticisms of Rawls’ methodology, including Hare’s remarkable charge that Rawls proposes a form of subjectivism according to which ‘thinking something can make it so’ (p. 174);3 Sandel’s and Walzer’s communitarian critiques; Nozick’s libertarian rejection of patterned or end-state principles of distributive justice; and, finally, G. A. Cohen’s luck-egalitarian criticism of Rawls’ acceptance of incentives-induced inequalities. Generally speaking, the selection of criticisms addressed is representative of the critical literature on Rawls, and the pro-et-contra arguments are well presented. However, as one who finds Cohen’s criticism of incentives-based inequalities very forceful, I was not convinced by Mandle’s dismissal of luck-egalitarian criticisms of Rawls.

Rawls’ difference principle is probably the part of his theory of justice that has attracted most attention. On one of the several non-overlapping formulations it receives in TJ it says that inequalities are just only if the worst off are as well off as possible. Most have understood this to mean that Rawls allows for just inequalities, namely, so-called incentives-induced inequalities. The idea is that talented people will not be motivated to make an extra effort if they must share whatever extra output they produce with all others, thereby imposing a strict equality regime. However, if one allows talented people to keep a significant proportion of the extra product that would result if they were to make an extra effort, taxing away the rest to benefit the worst off, they would be motivated to make this extra effort, and, accordingly, everyone would be better off than under an equal distribution. Thus, the difference principle would seem to allow this inequality and, setting aside his principle of fair equality of opportunity, it follows that Rawls is not an egalitarian in a strict sense.

Cohen rejects this view. He asks us to consider what makes incentives necessary for making the worst off as well off as possible. Aside from some cases that he finds marginal (cases in which talented people are psychologically unable to make an extra effort in the absence of incentives) or at any rate non-damaging to egalitarianism (cases in which extra rewards are necessary to compensate talented people for stressful jobs), Cohen contends that incentives are necessary to improve the situation of the worst off only because the talented people freely choose not to make an extra effort in the absence of incentives. But, Cohen argues, this refusal is incompatible with the difference principle — the worst off are worse off under incentives-induced inequalities than they would be if the talented decided to make an extra effort in the absence of incentives — and, accordingly, in a well-ordered society in which people act in their daily lives from Rawlsian principles of justice, talented people would not insist on incentives.

Mandle is not persuaded by this criticism. Unlike some philosophers who have rejected Cohen’s criticism, he does not dismiss it simply on the ground that Rawlsian principles of justice apply only to the basic structure of society and not to what we do in our daily lives. Rather, he quotes Rawls statement that ‘a complete theory of right includes principles for individuals as well’ (p. 195).4 However, the ‘question is whether the same principles that apply to the basic structure [i.e., the difference principle] must also apply to individual conduct’ (p. 195). Mandle is surely right that there is a question here, and Cohen offers some reasons for thinking that Rawls is committed to thinking that the difference principle applies to individual conduct as well.5 I am less sure what reasons Mandle offers in favor of the view that the former set of principles include the difference principle whereas the latter do not.

Another reply Mandle offers on Rawls’ behalf says that a just basic structure ‘is likely to have a significant effect on the ethos that guides individual conduct in the society’ (p. 195) so that talented people will not be inclined to insist on ‘extortion-like’ demands for incentives. However, Mandle concedes that this reply ‘does not refute [Cohen’s] critique’, although ‘it does somewhat blunt its force’ (p. 196). It does not refute this criticism because it does not show that it is impossible for there to be an incentives-induced inequality in a society satisfying Rawlsian requirements (as Mandle understands them) reflecting talented people’s choice not to produce as much as they could for the benefit of the worst-off in the absence of incentives (while still being no worse off than untalented people). The reason that it blunts its force is, I take it, that if a just Rawlsian basic structure results in an incentives-unfriendly ethos, as a matter of fact the amount of incentives needed to make the worst off as well off as possible is not so much greater than in a just Rawlsian-Cohenian society, where no or only very few incentives are necessary.

But I do not think Cohen would concede the latter point. After all, his criticism is put forward as a criticism of the incentives-friendly reading of the difference principle understood as a fundamental principle of justice and not as a principle of regulation, as it were. To refute the former sort of principle, you only need to show that it has a false implication in one case. Fundamental principles are either true or false. However, principles of regulation can lead to results that are more or less close to the target that we aim at through applying certain principles of regulation. Here there is a difference between a criticism saying that a principle of regulation is useless because using it gets us nowhere near the target and saying that while it does not get us to what we aim at, it gets us close enough. However, as I said, the point here is that Cohen wants to criticize the difference principle as a fundamental principle of justice, not as a principle of regulation. Presumably many Rawlsians are similarly inclined when, for instance, they do not say that the force of the Rawlsian critique of utilitarianism is somewhat blunted when it is shown that maximizing utility is often achieved through a basic structure that is not too different from one required to realize the difference principle.

All in all, Mandle thinks the incentives debate shows something important about ‘the fundamental contrast between Rawls and Cohen’ when it comes to their views on justice:

For Rawls, although the principles of justice are regulative, they are not “all controlling.” … For Cohen, in contrast, justice will give individuals no discretion concerning any action that affects the distribution of goods in society (p. 197).

I agree with Mandle that Rawls and Cohen might well have very different views of justice, but I wonder if this particular contrast captures well what this difference consists in. Note that Cohen is a luck-egalitarian, and if, as Mandle writes, this view implies that justice ‘requires an equal distribution of goods, except where an individual’s greater or lesser share can be traced to choices for which that individual is responsible’ (p. 198), it would seem to follow that, on Cohen’s view, justice gives one discretion to make any genuinely free choice that will lead to one’s having a greater or lesser share than others. True, if you have greater talents than me and we make the same choices, luck-egalitarian justice does not give you discretion to keep all of your greater rewards, but that is precisely because these greater rewards are not all traceable to your choices, as opposed to your greater talents.

By way of further characterization of the divide between Rawlsian and Cohenian views on justice, Mandle quotes Korsgaard as saying that the ‘subject matter of morality is not what we should bring about, but how we should relate to one another’ (p. 199), apparently suggesting that Rawls is concerned with the latter and that Cohen is exclusively concerned with the former.6 Again, this strikes me as a serious mischaracterization.

One theoretical item that plays an important role in Cohen’s critique of Rawls is the so-called ‘interpersonal test’, which

tests how robust a policy argument is by subjecting it to variation with respect to who is speaking and/or who is listening when the argument is presented. The test asks whether the argument could serve as a justification of a mooted policy when uttered by any member of society to any other member.7

If an argument fails the interpersonal test this implies that the sender and addressee of the argument fail to form what Cohen calls a ‘justificatory community’ — ‘a set of people among whom there prevails a norm’ such that

if what certain people are disposed to do when a policy is in force is part of the justification of that policy, it is considered appropriate to ask them to justify the relevant behavior, and it detracts from justificatory community when they cannot do so.8

The point of the interpersonal test and the concept of a justificatory community is, in essence, to bring out an I-thou perspective that is very crucial to Cohen’s way of thinking about justice and which he thinks is often overlooked when justifications for policies involving the conduct of individuals are stated from a third-person perspective. Whatever the difference between Rawls and Cohen is, it is not that Cohen is not concerned about ‘how we should relate to one another’.

Having paid significant attention to Mandle’s treatment of the relation between Rawls, luck-egalitarianism, and Cohen’s critique of incentives, I hasten to say this is only a small part of his book. While I have some serious reservations about this part, I still think it works reasonably well as part of a helpful introductory overview of the main responses to TJ, albeit one that is not entirely correct for the reasons indicated.

Writing a book of the sort Mandle has written here is not easy. TJ is a very complex work that covers a vast terrain in political philosophy and beyond, and while there are certainly important connections between the different parts of TJ, they are not always set out with great clarity. Going over most of the topics covered by TJ in about one-fifth of the number of pages of TJ does not result in an easily read book that forcefully brings out a handful of core ideas and arguments. Hence, as a plain introductory text to students who want to get the first grasp of the main ideas of Rawls and not much beyond that, Mandle’s book has less to offer than some of the other introductory works on the market. However, as an introductory text that students use as a supplement to a careful reading of TJ itself, it is an excellent book. For Rawls scholars, the book is interesting because of the way in which it critically comments on various received interpretations of TJ. It does justice to the two latter parts of TJ in a way that few other introductory texts do and is quite helpful in explaining the structure of these less well-read last 400 pages of TJ. Last, but not least, Mandle’s book is interesting because he couples his anti-luck egalitarian reading of Rawls with his view that Rawls favors property-owning democracy over welfare-state capitalism — because of how the former better than the latter ensures that citizens can relate to one another as equals. In making this connection, Mandle strikes a chord that is intriguing and very up-to-date in the light of Elizabeth Anderson’s and Samuel Scheffler’s recent critiques of luck-egalitarianism.9

1 Nozick R. (1974) Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York, Basic Books, p. 183 (cited Mandle p. 4).

2 Quoted from Rawls J. (1971/rev. ed. 1999) A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, Mass., Harvard UP, p. 529/463.

3 Quoted from Hare R. (1973) “Rawls’ Theory of Justice” in Daniels N. (1989) Reading Rawls. Stanford, CA, Stanford UP, 81-108, p. 83.

4 Rawls (1971/1999), p. 108/93.

5 See, for instance, Cohen G. A. (2008) Rescuing Justice and Equality, Cambridge, Mass., Harvard UP, pp. 68-86.

6 Korsgaard C. (1993) “The Reasons We Can Share” in Korsgaard C. (1996) Creating the Kingdom of Ends, Cambridge, Cambridge UP, 275-310, p. 275.

7 Cohen 2008, p. 42.

8 Cohen 2008, pp. 43-44.

9 Anderson E. (1999) “What is the Point of Equality?” Ethics 109, pp. 287-337; Scheffler S. (2003) “What is Egalitarianism?” Philosophy and Public Affairs 31, pp. 5-39.