Reading David Hume’s “Of the Standard of Taste”

Reading David Hume S Of The Standard Of Taste 1

Babette Babich (ed.), Reading David Hume’s “Of the Standard of Taste,” De Gruyter, 2019, 333pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 9783110585643.

Reviewed by Stephanie Ross, University of Missouri–St. Louis


 This book edited by Babette Babich is a welcome addition to scholarship focusing on Hume’s famous piece on aesthetics. Babich has assembled 12 papers as well as a copy of Hume’s 1757 essay that the papers address. The selections are grouped in three clusters titled “Of Taste and Standards,” “Causal Theory and the Problem, Dispositional Critique and the Classic,” and “Comparisons, Art, Anatomies,” but the collection might just as easily have been partitioned differently. For example, one alternative organization might first present papers that seek to explicate Hume’s theory and trace its relations to his classic earlier writings, then present papers that investigate possible flaws in Hume’s argument for a standard, next cluster papers that seek to show the Essay’s application to present-day concerns and problems, and finally conclude with papers that outline the relevance of Hume’s thought to continental philosophy.

In her introduction, Babich laments the preponderance of analytically-inclined philosophers nowadays and the concomitant loss of historical knowledge. Babich embarks on an extended discussion of Hume’s deathbed work. In particular, she engages with the late Hume scholar Annette Baier regarding which of Lucian of Samosata’s dialogs Hume referenced. While this is certainly a case of competing claimsthe accounts from Adam Smith and from Hume’s doctor William Cullen are in conflictthis seems a factual disagreement. I don’t see what bearing it has on the central topic of differences in taste. Nonetheless, Babich’s learning is certainly on display in this introduction. Among other things, she offers a bravura reading of an etching by Albrecht Dürer that illustrates another of Lucian’s dialogues. Babich explains: “Dürer’s allegory of rhetoric depicts Lucian’s Hermes not only as leading his captives by the ear, chained with amber and gold chains piercing his own tongue, but as psychagogue: leading or guiding souls on their journey in this world and beyond it” (9).

Turning to the essays in the collection, the first by Peter Kivy takes up the charge that Hume’s portrait of a true judge or ideal critic is viciously circular since such critics are singled out because they successfully identify good art, but good works of art are just those entities lauded by ideal critics. While Kivy thinks the circle remains problematic for Hume’s practice and comparison conditions, he does not think it affects the remaining requirementsdelicacy, freedom from prejudice, and good sensebecause these function in arenas other than the aesthetic. Since possession of these qualities can be discerned by attending to non-aesthetic contexts, the circle is broken. I take it we are to conclude that the theory is not mortally wounded. However, I have always considered practice and comparison crucial components of Hume’s approach. The experiences of repeatedly returning to given works and of toggling between particular works and others that might shed light on them are essential for correctly categorizing and explaining the candidates in question. If Kivy’s charges show that Hume cannot include these two items when listing the traits of Humean  ideal critics, then the revised theory cannot do the work it should. Happily, I believe that the parameters of Humean practice and comparison can be established by tracking similarities across worksfor example, by singling out works by the same artist, or from the same school, or with similar subjectsrather than by reference to work quality. If this is the case, no vicious circularity ensues.

Although it is tucked into the second set of essays, Roger Shiner’s paper, “Hume and the Causal Theory of Taste,” also advocates for a particular interpretation of Hume’s theory. Shiner distinguishes two possible construals of Hume’s claims, causal vs. criterial. While a causal approach takes judgments of taste to capture the way a particular sentiment is triggered in an appreciator, and where warring and/or amended verdicts differ in the nature of the sentiment brought about, the criterial approach instead directs attention to qualities in the objects that are being assessed. Shiner argues that the five requirements Hume ascribes to an ideal critic cannot be properly understood if the causal construal is adopted. He maintains that doing so would misrepresent critical activity (122). Throughout his essay, Shiner contrasts gustatory judgments, in particular, oenophiles’ reports on particular wines, with critical assessments of works of art. He suggests that a taster who labels a wine flinty can only be referring to aspects of her sensation, whereas an appreciator who notes the dynamic tautness of a string quartet can back up her claim by pointing out the harmonic structures, meters, and rhythms that create the tautness in question (125). A commitment to realism in aesthetics seems to underpin Shiner’s claims here.

Roger Scruton’s piece, “Taste and Order,” an excerpt from his book on beauty, reminds us of our desire for community and consensus. In contemplating the trajectories of taste, Scruton maintains that a change in taste is never brought about by rational argument. He does, however, concede that in critical arguments reasoning aspires to bring about a changed perception. In closing, Scruton briefly outlines Hume’s Copernican revolution whereby, in pursuit of objective standards of beauty, Hume urges us to turn our attention away from properties of objects and focus instead on the traits of those judging them. This sea-change allows us to compile a checklist of empirically verifiable attributes to allow identification of the ideal critics among us.

In her paper “Gendered Concepts and Hume’s Standard of Taste,” Carolyn Korsmeyer also probes the notion of critical consensus, but she does so through a feminist lens. Noting that Hume’s standard is not a set of principles but rather a group of people (100)here she echoes Scruton’s pointKorsmeyer traces the role that gendered concepts play in Hume’s account of common human nature. She offers fascinating glimpses into the attitudes towards marriage, modesty, gallantry, and more in Hume’s time. Although Hume had female friends with whom he enjoyed lively conversations, Korsmeyer concludes that women could not function as Humean ideal critics because women were excluded from public affairs, and because the cultivation of modesty and virtue precluded the breadth of experience needed to develop good taste (104, 108). It seems churlish to punish Hume for being a man of his time. Even if Korsmeyer is correct about the impediments women faced in the 1700s, we can leave Hume’s theory of taste intact and allow that changing mores have so enlarged the circle that today we can name eminent female critics across the arts.

Howard Caygill’s piece, “Taste and Civil Society”, in the second section of the collection offers a detailed history of British theories of taste. Arguing that Lord Shaftesbury, John Dennis, and Lord Kames all maintained that public and private interest were providentially aligned and used providential determinism to explain achievement of the general good, Caygill suggests that Hume attempted to solve the same problem without recourse to divinity. He identifies sympathy as the mechanism Hume recruits to accomplish this task and locates it as an intermediary between the providence embraced by the three theorists just named and the invisible hand posited by Adam Smith. While Caygill’s learned essay focuses on realms other than the aesthetic, it is intriguing to consider whether the providential explanation he documents in so many of Hume’s predecessors might also align appreciators and worthy works of art.

The great preponderance of contributors to this volume are philosophers, but a few other disciplines are represented. Christopher MacLachlan, who is a member of the English faculty at St Andrews, addresses the style of Hume’s essay, pointing out its framing use of ironies and arguing that Hume never resolves the central question of how we are to identify the Humean critics amongst us. MacLachlan devotes some time to a discussion of whether critics strive to adopt a general point of view and whether such a stance is even attainable. He reminds us that Hume’s account of freedom from prejudice requires that critics put themselves in the position of the intended audience of each work they assess. But assuming such transformation is possible, there is the threat of cultural relativism. MacLachlan concedes that critics have influence, but this need not involve a shared standard. Instead, he writes “Implicit in [Hume’s] relativism is the plurality of taste. Historically and geographically there is not one taste but many. These tastes are, as it were, assessments of prevailing critical opinion and preferences in particular times and places” (65).

I am not convinced that a radical relativism is the right take-away from this discussion. Hume’s positing of blameless differences helps pinpoint the determinants of individual critics’ preferences and analyses. But critical verdicts only carry weight when their proponents have amassed adequate experience (Humean practice and comparison) with the objects in question. Moreover, accounts by Arthur Danto, George Dickie, Jerrold Levinson, and others indicate that contextual factors help determine whether an object is a work of art, and, if so, what range of meanings can properly be accorded to it. Thus, interpreters of Hume can argue for a mitigated aesthetic realism where critical verdicts are supported by evidence and argumentation.

While several of the essays in this volume trace the relations between Hume’s aesthetics and his earlier writings on morality and on causation, two of them venture farther afield to explore the overlap with the work of other philosophers. Babich, the collection’s editor, addresses the affinity between Hume and Nietzsche, while Bernard Freydberg looks further back in the history of philosophy to trace connections between Hume and Plato. Babich establishes the legitimacy of her investigation by citing six previous works exploring connections between Hume and Nietzsche. While she isn’t arguing for any explicit influence, she frames her paper by noting that the “Homer question” posed by Nietzsche in his 1869 inaugural lecture inserts the notion of taste into judgments of the authorship of textual fragments. Thus she suggests there are commonalities uniting classical philology and aesthetics. Babich ventures farther afield exploring the nexus of taste and causality in the third section of her essay where she takes on the science of nutrition and Jean Anthelme Brillat-Savarin’s views on bread and weight gain! While Hume apparently experienced a 60 lb. weight gain during a skeptical crisis in his youth, she notes that Nietzsche “sought a specialized science of-and-for the specific individual” (228, 229). In her closing section Babich turns from bread to wine and discusses the famous example from Don Quixote taken up by Hume. She closes the circle by comparing wine connoisseurs judging a cask to be excellent and classical scholars making a judgment about authorship. Each judgment expresses the discerner’s subjective taste yet these come to form a standardizing foundation (240).

While I do not have space to comment on all the papers in this collection, I hope the sampling I’ve undertaken will entice readers interested in various aspects of Hume’s thought to search out this volume.