Reading Heidegger's Black Notebooks 1931-41

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Ingo Farin and Jeff Malpas (eds.), Reading Heidegger's Black Notebooks 1931-41, MIT Press, 2016, 361pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262034012.

Reviewed by Stephen Mulhall, New College, Oxford


From 1931 to the 1970s, alongside a range of other material (including lectures, essays and large, unified unpublished works), Heidegger also composed a series of notebooks -- around 34 in total. In 2014, the first such series, spanning the years 1931 to 1941, was published in the Gesamtausgabe (and have just been published in English translation); the second series, consisting of five volumes composed between 1942 and 1948 was published in 2015, and the others are all scheduled for publication in the near future. The first series consisted of fourteen individual volumes, with each given a title and number -- usually √úberlegungen or Considerations. Since all thirty-four volumes were written in black oilcloth booklets, and so equally count as part of Heidegger's 'Black Notebooks', the first series that is under examination in the book under review should more accurately be called the Considerations notebooks. Despite this, most of the book's contributors other than the editors use the former title, and it is under that suitably (but adventitiously) ominous title that this first series of notebooks has generated such controversy over the last eighteen months or so. For of course, these notebooks have been heralded as providing decisive new evidence of the full extent of Heidegger's investment in Nazism and anti-Semitism, and of the extent to which his philosophical work is pervaded and structured by both investments; and the primary value of Ingo Farin and Jeff Malpas's volume is to show that they do no such thing. For what it shows above all is how far we are from establishing the conditions for the possibility of making well-grounded knowledge claims about either of these matters.

The editorial contributions which book-end the collection are particularly helpful in this respect. Malpas's opening essay and Farin's closing companion piece together provide a marvellously sane and clear-headed registration of the conceptual and philosophical complexities attendant on formulating even the most simple or basic facts of this matter -- the latest iteration of a 'Heidegger affair' that has been conducted episodically for decades. That Heidegger was a Nazi and that he also held anti-Semitic views are claims to which most participants in these controversies would accede: but they disagree not only about how these claims are to be interpreted so as to make them come out true, but also about their significance (even given agreement on the relevant interpretation). It was already well-known that Heidegger was a member of the Nazi party; but it remains open to argument for how long (if at all) he was loyal to it, and how far he accepted that party's official ideological stances as opposed to projecting upon that movement his own idiosyncratic understanding of what National Socialism might be or make possible. It was also well-known that Heidegger expressed anti-Semitic views at various points in his life in a variety of contexts; but this too leaves many matters open to argument. Exactly what kind of anti-Semitic stance is expressed in those formulations (is it based on ideas of cultural or natural difference, and how stable is that distinction?)? To what extent is Heidegger here mindlessly reiterating views widely regarded as platitudinous in 1930s Germany (and elsewhere in Europe) or instead finding a way to make those views his own? Is there a distinction to be drawn between someone occasionally expressing anti-Semitic views and that person being an anti-Semite? And what relation is there is between such views and the philosophical project or projects Heidegger was undertaking throughout his intellectual life?

One might think of the first three of these questions as bearing on the biographical or personal dimension of this affair: what is at issue is our moral judgement of a particular individual's views and actions at a particular (and particularly fateful) period in Western European history. Here, much of what is asserted in this collection of essays -- as in so much of the rest of this discussion -- oscillates unstably between two complementary forms of moralism. First, there are the moralistic denunciations of Heidegger that show no willingness even to consider proportioning the degree of one's condemnation to the specific character of the crime committed, or to the particular political, cultural and historical contexts within which it was committed; these critics often appear to assume that any attempt to question such condemnations must itself be symptomatic of equivalent moral failings in the questioner. But then there are the moralistic denunciations of these denunciations, whose authors show little awareness that self-righteous criticisms of the self-righteous risk making their own acknowledgements of Heidegger's lethal vulgarities seem merely formulaic. It's as if the various parties to this controversy have difficulty recalling the possibility that those to whom they address their remarks are decent human beings.

I don't mean to suggest that avoiding moralism in this context -- or more generally, meaning what one says and saying what one means about such matters -- is easy. Finding humanly responsible ways of talking about anti-Semitism after the genocidal barbarities of Western European history in the twentieth century, words that neither avoid the responsibilities of judgement nor imply that the one judging is essentially untouched and untouchable by such repellent human failings, is no straightforward task. But the strength and inflexibility of the anger brought forth on both sides of this supposedly biographical matter suggests that both parties feel that something more than the moral standing of one person is at issue here -- something more like the moral standing of Heideggerian philosophy (and so of many of the most influential philosophical traditions that emerged from or were inflected by his work), or even of philosophy as such.

Which brings us to the last of my four questions -- the one that might be regarded as philosophical rather than personal, except that the stability and significance of the distinction between the personal and the philosophical is itself open to question, and particularly so for those who have inherited Heidegger's ways of thinking. It is certainly a question of primary importance to anyone inclined to attribute real significance to those projects (or at least interested in understanding why so many philosophers in the twentieth century and the current one persist in doing so), and it is ostensibly the central focus of this collection of essays.

It is, accordingly, worth trying to state as uncontroversially as possible what these notebooks add in terms of textual evidence to the existing hermeneutic and critical domain of the 'Heidegger affair'. According to the accounts given in this collection, the Considerations amount to more than 1200 pages of text, and within it commentators have found somewhere between ten and fifteen passages -- amounting to some two or three pages in total -- in which Heidegger makes remarks about 'international Jewry' or 'World Jewry' (the German term here is Weltjudentum) whose nature is plainly not only critical but polemically so; and although more than one commentator in this volume points out that these terms also play a central role in Theodor Herzl's Zionist project and manifestoes of the 1930s, none deny that Heidegger deploys them in ways that invoke horribly familiar anti-Semitic tropes. This is certainly profoundly dispiriting; but it does not on the face of it seem like a transformational addition to the small but more-than-sufficiently sorry collection of well-known parallel passages in other Heidegger texts -- particularly when, as one of the editors points out, none of them show up before 1938, long after Heidegger had broken with any intellectual fealty to the political formations of National Socialism in Germany, and was in fact subjecting it to increasingly contemptuous criticism. And yet, the appearance of the Considerations, and so of these occasional remarks, was prefaced by a pronouncement by the editor of the relevant Gesamtausgabe volumes (Peter Trawny) that these remarks established that Heidegger's anti-semitism was not so much personal as ontohistorical -- that is, woven into the basic structures of his evolving post-Being and Time reformulation of how philosophy might overcome metaphysics and achieve a genuine apprehension of Being and its essentially historical dispensations.

Although Trawny contributes an essay to this volume, he does not reiterate his arguments for that pronouncement or respond to the many and varied criticisms of it advanced by others (some of whom also contribute to this volume, and continue those lines of criticism). Other contributors do, however, offer related ways of trying to reach Trawny's conclusion, and these deserve serious consideration, both in their own right and as exemplary of the general argumentative strategies needed to do so: I am thinking here of Michael Fagenblat's essay '"Heidegger" and The Jews' and Donatella Di Cesare's 'Heidegger's Metaphysical Anti-Semitism'. Their arguments exemplify two mutually supportive interpretative strategies, each of which aims to broaden the field of relevant textual passages beyond those explicitly referring to 'the Jews', and thereby to deepen their significance.

The first strategy is to connect those explicit remarks to what di Cesare calls a range of indirect references that amount to a broader 'conceptual network that surrounds, delimits, and . . . defines the Jew' (p 183): the relevant terms include 'desertification', 'herd's essence', 'the "circumcision" of knowledge' and the 'community of the chosen' (a rather heterogeneous collection with very different degrees of intimacy with the explicit terms), but the really central ones are 'rootedness', 'deracination' and 'calculative ability'. It is on their basis that Fagenblat erects his version of the argument that Heidegger's philosophical project generates a metaphysical form of anti-Semitism. On Fagenblat's account, Weltjudentum typifies, propagates and intensifies the cardinal sins of 'empty rationality and calculative efficiency' -- the technological or machinational drive towards order for order's sake that Heidegger's developing thinking in the 1930s is coming to see as lying at the heart of modernity and all its ills; and this internal relation is grounded in the supposed rootlessness of Judaism -- because they, more than any other people, in Heidegger's view, 'are alienated from their concrete historical existence' (p 148).

Even Fagenblat admits, however, that Heidegger does not think that Weltjudentum is responsible either for initiating this overwhelming of Being or for globalizing it: the root causes are rather Platonism, Christianity, Cartesianism, Neo-Kantianism and scientism (amongst many others, including Americanism and Anglo-Saxonism). One might well question Heidegger's apparently inveterate tendency to think in terms of such 'isms'; one might also regard his complete exclusion of Jerusalem from the Graeco-German axis of his Western European history of Being as dubious in itself and dubiously motivated. But the evidence marshalled here hardly suggests a constitutive role for international Jewry in Heidegger's account of Being's progressively damaging self-forgetting, and so hardly supports the charge that his evolution of a 'history of Being' approach to thinking is essentially anti-Semitic in its nature or trajectory.

If the most philosophically fateful version of the charge against Heidegger's intellectual projects on offer here is therefore (at the very best) not proven, its consideration certainly makes clear that any properly attentive critical evaluation of this new material depends upon achieving a better understanding of the relation of these notebooks to the rest of Heidegger's body of writing. And some hardy contributors to this collection make a sustained and often valuable attempt to focus more or less exclusively on that issue. This requires them to confront such questions as: whether the notebooks themselves are best understood as rough preparatory notes or as designed for public consumption from the outset; how the thoughts worked out in the notebooks specifically relate to the major texts of the 1930s, including hugely challenging texts such as Contributions to Philosophy or Besinnung; and how they help us to track and better understand the way in which Heidegger's work after his early masterpiece Being and Time evolves by maintaining lines of continuity with that opening achievement whilst radically criticizing some of its central presuppositions. The essays by Jean Grondin, Holger Zaborowski, Thomas Rohkrämer and Nancy A. Weston are amongst the most helpful here, although more glancing insights can be found at other points throughout the collection.

On balance, then, the risks inherent in attempting to put together a substantial scholarly contribution to this debate quickly enough for it to help shape it, and so to inform the disciplinary reception of this new material, do not outweigh its benefits. One or two contributions show signs of hasty composition, and it would have been very helpful to the reader if time had allowed contributors to read and respond to the contributions of others -- and in particular those of their editors; for then, at a number of points at which they encounter distinctions that the editors show to be open to question, they might not have been so quick to handle them as if they were either beyond question or unquestionably irrelevant. Nevertheless, the collection as a whole does succeed in casting some new light on various aspects of the 'Heidegger affair'. Perhaps the most important moral to be drawn, however, is that -- as Heidegger's decision to include the Black Notebooks in his Gesamtausgabe suggests -- their long-term value is most likely to lie in the contribution they make to understanding the complex, multi-facetted and above all slow, faltering and self-questioning manner in which Heidegger struggled to find a new way of re-founding the philosophical journey that began with Being and Time.