Reading Merleau-Ponty: On Phenomenology of Perception

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Thomas Baldwin (ed.), Reading Merleau-Ponty: On Phenomenology of Perception, Routledge, 2007, 170pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415399944.

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College


This excellent volume contains most of the papers read at an Anglo-French colloquium on Merleau-Ponty held at the Collège de France in the summer of 2005, plus two additional essays (by Sean Kelly and Mark Wrathall) not presented there. The colloquium itself may have been Anglo-French, but the authors are overwhelmingly Anglo. The book is neither an introduction for beginners wholly unfamiliar with Merleau-Ponty's thought nor an academic exercise exclusively for specialists. Instead, the collection offers an engaging mixture of textual interpretation and critical argument to those who already have at least a rough sense of what Phenomenology of Perception is all about.

In the first essay, "The Flesh of Perception: Merleau-Ponty and Husserl," A. D. Smith defends Husserl against charges of intellectualism, charges he thinks some of Husserl's critics have wrongly ascribed to Merleau-Ponty himself. For his part, Smith writes, Merleau-Ponty "refuses to characterise Husserl as an intellectualist" (11). Indeed, for Smith, "there is nothing radically new in Merleau-Ponty, as compared with Husserl" (20); Merleau-Ponty's position, critically situated as it is between empiricism and intellectualism, "is all already there in Husserl" (5).

It is true that Merleau-Ponty does not list Husserl among the classic intellectualists, for Husserl does not attempt to explain perceptual awareness in terms of judgment or intellect. It is also true, however, that Merleau-Ponty generally bends over backwards to avoid direct critical confrontation with Husserl, and this leaves his assessment of his predecessor rather unclear, to say the least. Smith rests his defense of Husserl on the following dubious tactical argument:

Given that Merleau-Ponty has staked out his own position as the only alternative to both empiricism and intellectualism, and given that Husserl subscribed to neither of these, it straightforwardly follows that Husserl already occupied the position that Merleau-Ponty has staked out for himself. (11)

This, it must be said, is a gross simplification of the actual spectrum of possibilities. Merleau-Ponty might well have considered his own position the only plausible alternative to empiricism and intellectualism, but it is hard to see how he could have considered it the only conceivable alternative. But only in that latter (absurd) case can Husserl so easily qualify as having anticipated Merleau-Ponty's view, for all that required was disavowing both empiricism and intellectualism. Surely there are numerous implausible alternatives to both empiricism and intellectualism, and for all we know Husserl's theory may be among them.

But even this radically understates the complexity of the issues, for surely many theorists are not simply and categorically empiricists, intellectualists, or Merleau-Pontians, but instead incline more or less in this or that way, in this or that respect, toward this or that view, depending on the context and the problems at hand. Descartes was a rationalist, and so was Kant, yet Kant's rationalism was tempered by an appreciation of sensory constraints on objective experience in a way Descartes's was not. So too, Husserl's position might sometimes lean in an intellectualist direction without his being a card-carrying Cartesian rationalist.

Establishing that Husserl was not an intellectualist like Descartes or Kant therefore does little to assimilate his position to Merleau-Ponty's, for what separates them is not the role of judgment or intellect in experience, but rather the relation between experience and the body. Husserl's theory of embodiment is widely misunderstood, and it seems to me Smith's argument largely perpetuates the misunderstanding. Simply put, intentional awareness primitively belongs to the body for Merleau-Ponty in a way that it does not for Husserl.

Smith quotes Husserl saying that the world is "so constituted that the I itself steps forth as embodied. As a bodily I, as an I that truly lives in the world, it is itself a worldly being" (5). But passages like this, which Smith construes as "just the beginning of Husserl's agreement with Merleau-Ponty" (5), in fact already point up the crucial difference between them. The I can "step forth" as embodied and worldly, according to Husserl, only because pure consciousness and the transcendental ego essentially stand separated from reality and the world, as Husserl likes to say, by an "abyss."[1] My sense of embodiment is constituted, Husserl argues, by my locating in this (my) body tactile sensations I experience as belonging to myself regarded in a more primitive, nonbodily way. Primitively, that is, for Husserl, as for Descartes, "all sensings belong to my soul (Seele), everything extended [belongs] to the material thing."[2] I identify my experience as inhabiting this body thanks to my localizing my sensations in it, together with my voluntary control of its movements. Husserl's account thus presupposes an underlying nonbodily ownership of experience and agency, which must then be constituted as bodily by means of its association with this (my) body. Smith observes that, according to Husserl, the transcendental ego is itself a constituted, not just a constituting subject. But constituting or constituted, active or passive, such a nonbodily ego is precisely what Merleau-Ponty rejects when he insists throughout the Phenomenology that the one and only subject of perception is the body itself -- not the soul, the mind, or any putative pure or transcendental ego.[3]

The second essay, "What Do We See (When We Do)?" is a reprinted version of a paper that first appeared in Philosophical Topics in 1999. In it, Sean Kelly argues convincingly that empiricist theories of perception systematically fail to come to grips with perceptual constancies -- the apparent constant size of things moving closer to and farther away from us, the apparent constant color of things in varying lighting conditions, and so on -- while intellectualist theories fail to recognize the way in which perceptible qualities are not determinate, detachable, free-floating properties, as it were, but aspects "saturated" (on analogy with Fregean concepts) when we experience them as concretely embedded in the things of which they are aspects: as Sartre observed, the carpet in a Matisse painting is not just red, but "woolly red." Kelly also makes an eloquent plea for the mutual interdependence of phenomenological description and analytical argumentation. Only arguments can furnish decisive proof, but only descriptive sensitivity can guarantee the pertinence of analytical argument to real-world phenomena actually motivating philosophical reflection.

The third and fourth essays form an interesting exchange between Komarine Romdenh-Romluc and Hubert Dreyfus concerning the role of thought in action. Merleau-Ponty regards perception and bodily movement as essentially intertwined, two sides of a coin; thought is a derivative phenomenon occurring against a background of perception and behavior, not a necessary ingredient for action. Dreyfus is well known for emphasizing the role of unreflective, nondeliberate, subintentional "absorbed coping skills," marshalling Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty against the widespread cognitivist assumption that intelligent action must be driven by thought. And yet surely thought can and often does motivate action, not just when skillful coping breaks down, but simply because an idea occurs to us and we act on it. Such episodes are not ubiquitous, but they are perfectly ordinary, and Romdenh-Romluc worries that Dreyfus has left no room for them in his version of Merleau-Ponty's account.

In reply, Dreyfus concedes that neither he nor Merleau-Ponty has an explicit theory of cognitive motivation, but suggests that Romdenh-Romluc has perhaps drawn too sharp a distinction between absorbed coping and thought-driven action. True, Merleau-Ponty says nothing about what makes detached reflection and deliberate action possible. Still, his phenomenology arguably has the resources to describe intelligent lateral shifts of attention within a situation. A certain degree of thought or deliberation, that is, might emerge not from "stepping back" and disengaging from one's current tasks, but from maintaining a horizonal sensitivity to affordances lying on the fringes of one's immediate focused concern. Dreyfus is right to stress this kind of lateral or background responsiveness to the environment, indeed this is just what Merleau-Ponty calls "motor intentionality," our abiding awareness of being open to an environment with stable horizons. Victims of brain damage suffering from visual form agnosia, like Kurt Goldstein's patient "Schneider," who figures prominently in the Phenomenology, lack that open perceptual awareness and seem virtually blind to all but those affordances that happen to be directly geared into their current bodily behavior.

In the fifth essay, "The Phenomenology of Social Rules," Mark Wrathall offers an account of a form of "motivation" that Merleau-Ponty insists is neither causal nor rational, but something in between. More specifically, Wrathall urges that our actions can be governed by rules even when we are not applying or following those rules, and even though our behavior is not just indirectly caused by them, as on Searle's theory of "the Background." When I am governed by a rule that I am not applying or following, I am not just brutely shaped by it; I am sensitive to its normative force.

Wrathall's account strikes me as phenomenologically correct, but just a bit metaphysically worrisome. In many cases of normative responsiveness, he says, "the rule is actually present in the things themselves" (83). But is it the rule itself that is present in such situations? A rule, it seems to me, is just what is stated in an explicit statement of the rule. My responsiveness, by contrast, need not have the articulated structure of such a canonical statement. What we ought to say, then, it seems to me, is not that I am directly responsive to a rule that is somehow present in the situation itself, but that what I am sensitive to is something more like a normative aspect or feature of the world that in turn bears a social or historical relation to the rule as explicitly stated. Rules imbue the world with a certain normative texture, we might say, but it is that often vague, indeterminate texture that directly motivates my behavior; what my behavior is tracking is not the rule as such, but the more palpable normative grooves in the social world it has, so to speak, left in its wake. This is why, in order to be truly responsive to laws as such in any very fine-grained way, you need a lawyer, not just good instincts. Our behavior is governed by laws, but not because laws directly inhabit the mundane social world, but because we are responsive to the less determinate norms and customs that have in turn been shaped by those laws. Social rules generally, it seems to me, are often mediated by a distinct form of normativity that is not equivalent to the articulate structure of the rules themselves.

Thomas Baldwin's "Speaking and Spoken Speech" is a helpful explanation of Merleau-Ponty's distinction between two aspects of language: spontaneous expressive behavior and sedimented or codified systems of signs. Baldwin suggests, plausibly, that Merleau-Ponty moved from a somewhat uncritical emphasis on the primacy and autonomy of the former to a more balanced notion, otherwise associated with Wittgenstein and Derrida, that even free expression can occur only within a publicly intelligible linguistic institution or system of signs.

In "The Genius of Man," Simon Glendinning worries about the radical difference Merleau-Ponty sees between (other) animals and human beings, that is, "between a purely natural life and a natural life everywhere informed by culture" (117, n11). Glendinning's complaint is not that Merleau-Ponty overstates the difference, but that he posits it uncritically, forgetting the anthropomorphic perspective that necessarily imbues it with the significance we tend to see in it. Glendinning's way of putting this is to charge Merleau-Ponty with a kind of "cognitivism" with respect to the difference, that is, a naïve insistence that the difference between (other) animals and us is simply an objective fact about the world, not a reflection of our own peculiar attitudes or values.

I don't see why it can't be both. Again, Glendinning does not deny that there is a profound difference between human beings and other species. At one point he suggests that other animals can also be said to have their own "culture and history" (115), but since he doesn't say what he means by those words, it is hard to see that claim as anything more than an arbitrary terminological gesture. Granted, unlike the myriad differences between a butterfly and an antelope, the physiological, behavioral, cognitive, linguistic, and cultural differences between human beings and chimpanzees is bound to seem especially poignant to us human beings. For we care about the second bunch of differences in a way we (most of us) don't care about the first. It is good to remind ourselves that the importance or significance of such facts is rooted in what we happen to care about. But none of this speaks against adopting a cognitive attitude with respect to them as plain old objective facts.

More importantly, it seems to me, none of this cuts any ice against Merleau-Ponty's view of the matter, for of course phenomenology is an avowedly anthropocentric enterprise. Unlike the natural sciences, that is, it does not purport to uncover and catalogue facts about the world that bear no essential relation to our values and attitudes; it is instead precisely an attempt to characterize the ways in which things show up for us within the horizons of our experience, our interests, our perspectives, our values.

Finally, Naomi Eilan's "Consciousness, Self-Consciousness and Communication" is a rigorous and fascinating evaluation of Merleau-Ponty's claims concerning shared experience in his essay, "The Child's Relation with Others." As she observes, Merleau-Ponty does not say enough to establish that empathy is more basic than the first- and third-person thoughts out of which others have tried to construct it. She draws a very helpful distinction between Merleau-Ponty's approach, which emphasizes the way in which perception is geared into action, and epistemologically oriented theories, which try to explain how experience gives rise to knowledge. That difference might explain why Merleau-Ponty says so little about joint attention to objects and its relation to the (uniquely human) capacity of "declarative pointing," an early indication that a child has a relatively nonegocentric grip on a public, objective world.

At the end of her essay Eilan wonders whether, in place of a theory emphasizing the emergence of such theoretical attitudes, Merleau-Ponty might have preferred an account of second-person thought in terms of a child's incipient practical sensitivity to the intentions of others. If so, it seems to me, he would have had to describe that sensitivity in terms very different from the mentalistic Gricean idiom in which such theories are often cast. As Vygotsky and others have suggested, language may be a tool for doing before it can be a tool of knowing, but the kind of doing suited to Merleau-Ponty's purposes would have to be one that did not already presuppose the differentiated first- and third-person concepts of intention that we apply as adults. Clearly, more work -- both empirical and phenomenological -- needs to be done on the status of the second person in experience, in action, and in thought.

[1] Husserl, Ideen I. K. Schumann, ed. Hua III (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1976), 93, 184.

[2] Husserl, Ideen II. W. Biemel, ed. Hua IV (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1952), 150.

[3] See my Merleau-Ponty (London and New York: Routledge, 2008), 127-32.