Reading Nietzsche Through the Ancients: An Analysis of Becoming, Perspectivism, and the Principle of Non-Contradiction

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Matthew Meyer, Reading Nietzsche Through the Ancients: An Analysis of Becoming, Perspectivism, and the Principle of Non-Contradiction, De Gruyter, 2014, 304pp., $127.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781934078419.

Reviewed by Jessica N. Berry and Jennifer Daigle, Georgia State University


In this book, Matthew Meyer argues for the attribution to Nietzsche of a relational ontology according to which "everything exists and is what it is only in relation to something else" (p. 8). Nietzsche's embrace of this ontology, which Meyer calls "the cornerstone for his philosophical project" (p. 34), is supposed to be entailed by his acceptance of a unity of opposites doctrine and a commitment to absolute becoming, both inherited from the pre-Platonic thinker Heraclitus of Ephesus.[1] Appreciating these fundamental commitments and their connection to other of Nietzsche's central ideas, Meyer believes, will bring into clearer focus the broad outlines of his "philosophy of the future" (p. 23).

In arguing for this reading, Meyer supposes that Heraclitus is a radical flux theorist, and he contends that Nietzsche is a Heraclitean in this respect. The first claim is more problematic than it might initially appear and remains undefended, and the second, defended primarily on the basis of texts Nietzsche elected not to publish, generates a threat of almost total incoherence easily avoidable on more reasonable interpretations of Nietzsche's thought -- interpretations to which we think Meyer gives insufficient consideration. Since "even more worrisome is the lack of clarity" about what these Heraclitean doctrines could even mean (p. 34), Meyer's efforts are for the most part devoted to explaining them and to showing that the difficulties they entail are not insurmountable. But this task has him turning to ancient figures and texts not much discussed by Nietzsche, in order to tease out subtle philosophical solutions that Nietzsche, even on Meyer's account, may not have seen and that we are unconvinced he needs.

Although some version of the Heraclitean Flusslehre retains its grip on the popular imagination, there are good reasons to question whether Heraclitus ever promoted such a thing, at least not in any particularly radical form.[2] The extant fragments are hardly unambiguous on this score, and the radical interpretation itself derives largely from Plato's motivated and hostile caricature of Heraclitus. Since we see Heraclitus in Meyer's book exclusively through Plato's lens, it is no surprise that he appears as an apostle of chaos. But even Nietzsche's presentation is not as unambiguous as Meyer's reading suggests. Nietzsche's Heraclitus appears in Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (PTAG) like a "divine stroke of lightning"; his "intuitive thinking" reveals "independent of all experience" a world of "unfailing certainties, ever-like orbits of lawfulness" that exclude precisely "caprice, disorder, lawlessness [and] contradiction."[3] And among Nietzsche's contemporaries, including some on whose work Nietzsche relies when writing the lecture notes Meyer refers us to again and again, many understood Heraclitus in a far less radical way than Meyer does. Since Meyer never makes his readers aware of these complexities, his reading takes for granted -- and actually reinforces -- the popular though dubious claim that Heraclitus is committed to a flux ontology so radical as to yield "a world that we cannot think" (p. 8).

Even if we grant this view of Heraclitus, the question would remain open as to whether Nietzsche's widely and rightly acknowledged enthusiasm for him entails that he shares all of these commitments. For even on Meyer's own account, in the very passages that are supposed to provide crucial support for his interpretation, "it is not altogether clear that Nietzsche intends to commit himself to this view" (p. 34; see also pp. 6, 225). These pieces of text, which lay the foundation for Meyer's case, are the first and second sections respectively of what he calls "Nietzsche's two most philosophically significant published works, namely Human, All Too Human and Beyond Good and Evil" (p. 6). Casting these passages as oblique and "subtle expressions of Nietzsche's commitment to a Heraclitean unity of opposites doctrine" (p. 6), Meyer takes them to be indispensible for the attribution to Nietzsche of this flux ontology, and thus for understanding Nietzsche's overall project. If their centrality, their allusion to Heraclitus, or their concern with ontology are not evident, as we reckon they will not be to most readers, it may be because these passages, which disclose Nietzsche's most important ideas, are also alleged to be impenetrable on their own terms. Regrettably, it seems, when it matters most, Nietzsche's style just gets in his own way (pp. 34-35).

Consequently, Meyer says, "one is forced to generate a theoretical framework from Nietzsche's unpublished texts and fragments in order to decipher the meaning of the claims he puts forth in his published works" (p. 35, emphasis added). In the introduction and his first of five chapters, Meyer begins doing just that, starting with PTAG where, he argues, we can see how Nietzsche's acceptance of Heraclitus' solution to the problem of becoming pegs him as a relational ontologist. In his third and fifth chapters, Meyer applies this theoretical framework to the crucial sections of Human, All Too Human (HH §1) and Beyond Good and Evil (BGE §2), and surrounding passages, in order to show how this ontological commitment "forms the basis of Nietzsche's rejection of self-identical things, the falsification thesis,[4] a certain sort of skepticism, the tragic tension between life and truth, and ultimately his perspectivism" (p. 34).[5] Throughout these chapters, Meyer's appeal to the unpublished material is neither illustrative nor merely clarificatory; his reading is indefensible without it. While readers who would "lump" together Nietzsche's unpublished and published texts will be unperturbed by this feature of Meyer's study, it will no doubt worry those who prefer a clear "split" between the two and who give almost exclusive weight to the latter. To be clear, though, we do not mean to suggest that the acceptability of Meyer's reading hinges on whether one is a "lumper" or a "splitter," since serious questions remain both about the soundness of his arguments and about his readings of the published and unpublished material. In most cases, the turn to the Nachlass just seems unnecessary, because the opacity of the published work is overstated; in others, however, it appears question begging, and it sits uneasily in any case with the one methodological principle Meyer expressly promises to adopt.

On this "priority principle" to which Meyer says he will hold, "Nietzsche's positions in the published works have priority over those in the Nachlass, both in terms of our attention and in cases of potential conflict" (p. 17). This methodological scruple, however, frequently and in crucial places gives way. To take one example, in his chapter on HH Meyer twice concedes that the language of its crucial opening aphorism doesn't support a position as radical as the one he wants to find there (pp. 136, 138). Indeed, "it is only Nietzsche's [unpublished] 1888 revision of the passage that explicitly mentions becoming," which leads Meyer here and elsewhere to retreat to the notebooks (p. 138). So although Meyer says that, in principle, "the primary but not exclusive value of the Nachlass consists in helping the interpreter explain and expand upon the views expressed in the published works" (p. 17), we should rightly wonder why, as a matter of practice, his approach doesn't look all that different from the one he identifies as Heideggarian. For it would seem that the only difference between Meyer's approach and this one, according to which "Nietzsche's genuine philosophy is to be found in his unpublished fragments and notes" (p. 14), is that Meyer offers a justification for his turn to the unpublished work that he says Heidegger does not -- namely, the obscurity and esotericism he finds in the books Nietzsche intended for publication. That obscurity not only invites or encourages, but necessitates a turn to the Nachlass, because there "Nietzsche not only reveals in a rather straightforward manner what he thinks, but he occasionally explains why he thinks the way he does" (p. 15). But this claim, we believe, begs important questions about whether and when the notebook fragments do in fact truly and "straightforwardly" state Nietzsche's beliefs.

Moreover, since we find neither of HH §1 or BGE §2, nor the books in which they appear, as impenetrable as Meyer does, we are unmoved by his argument that understanding them "forces" us to turn elsewhere to generate a theoretical framework to make sense of them (p. 35). Meyer tells us that "Nietzsche's obscure style in these texts does not readily allow for the development of nuanced responses to [the] questions" most urgently raised by his commitment to the unity of opposites and absolute becoming (pp. 34-35). Such questions include whether Nietzsche is thereby committed to the claim that some objects instantiate opposite properties, in the same way and at the same time. Or can he mean that opposites "transform themselves into each other" (p. 35)? Is his "doctrine of becoming" just the view that "there are no eternal substances," or is he committed to something more radical, like the view that "there are no things but only relational forces, motions, or processes" (p. 35)? Meyer is surely right that the opening aphorisms of these books don't allow for the development of "nuanced responses" to these (or any other) questions of fundamental ontology; but only somebody already wedded to a Heraclitean reading would expect them to. Sure, these are vexing questions, but they don't even arise within the context of these opening aphorisms, where Nietzsche's talk about opposites and becoming refer us, not to esoteric ontological quandaries or doctrines, but to problems of value.

In HH §1, for instance, Meyer finds Nietzsche's reference to the question of how something could "originate in its opposite" enigmatic. But Nietzsche is simply pointing, in a way he does in many of his published works, to what we might call the problem of opposite values.[6] Philosophers have had a difficult time accepting that, for instance, the value we accord "disinterested contemplation" could have had its origin "in covetous desire," or "living for others in egoism," but that is what Nietzsche sets out to show (HH §1). He is suspicious that the unconditional value we ascribe to selflessness and altruistic behavior grew, organically, out of very different, even opposing value schemes; he suggests that "good" values have grown out of the ground of bad conscience and ressentiment, out of the will to self-laceration and even self-annihilation. This hypothesis is a constant motif of the published corpus.[7] It is explaining how such a thing is possible at all that is the cornerstone of Nietzsche's philosophical project. It's a big project, and we think it leaves little room (or motive) for his doing First Philosophy.

Even if Meyer had cinched Nietzsche's commitment to this Heraclitean worldview, the victory would be Pyrrhic, since it immediately saddles him with the task of explaining away its inconvenient philosophical consequences. His second and fourth chapters are devoted to showing that this flux ontology, despite its consequences, some of which he admits are unpalatable (p. 217) and may appear "philosophically weak or even silly by contemporary standards" (p. 16), is at least not self-refuting or ultimately incoherent, and that it needn't deprive Nietzsche's philosophical project of its impact. Key to this defense is a "two-level" solution, according to which the apparently all-consuming perspectivism allegedly entailed by "Nietzsche's Heracliteanism" applies to everything except "his central views on ethics, metaphysics, and even perspectivism itself" (p. 11). Yet Meyer has no convincing reply to readers who find this move "'suspiciously ad hoc'" (p. 155).[8] And where efforts to defend the view give out entirely, Meyer merely insists that it is "not the result of an improper interpretation of Nietzsche's texts, but rather the result of what Nietzsche himself says" (p. 235, see also pp. 46-47, 199). Clearly, good interpretive practice demands that we avoid the sympathetic fallacy and face up to the problems and inconsistencies that remain after our best interpretive work is done. In this case, however, not only do the problems appear to us to be created by the interpretation itself, but Meyer's concession appears to underestimate them.

Indeed, methodological concerns aside, readers should find the worldview attendant on "Nietzsche's Heracliteanism" to be nothing short of alarming. It "deems the middle-sized objects of everyday experience falsifications of a true world that is best described in terms of dynamic relations" (p. 49, emphasis added), defies representation at either the logical or commonsense linguistic level, and has Nietzsche "now rejecting the claim that reason can be used as a means for unpacking the structure of nature" (p. 137). Nietzsche accepts "that the world is one of relations without preexisting relata, predicates without subjects, deeds without doers, etc. This, according to Nietzsche, is a world that we cannot think" (p. 8). Though we find ourselves hard-pressed to understand how this ontology doesn't altogether do away with science in any recognizable form, Meyer insists that it is fully in keeping with some sort of naturalism (p. 2). More than that, it is supposed to be a consequence of Nietzsche's strict empiricism, his engagement with the naturalistic disciplines of his day (p. 47), and his continuing commitment to the natural sciences (p. 137). Meyer's Nietzsche has recognized that the devastating -- indeed, tragic -- truth about the world is that what you see of it is in no way what you get, and that what you get, in reality, cannot be represented in language or thought. Ultimately, on this picture, "creating is a form of knowing" (p. 259), so if there are any constraints on what passes for knowledge, it is unclear what they could be. These conclusions are supposed to be available empirically, and only empirically, that is, by means of the very senses that misleadingly tell us we live in a world populated by relatively stable, medium-sized dry goods. As a picture of reality and our knowledge and experience of it, this is a tough one to bring into focus.

One way to avoid all these and other untoward consequences of the "Heraclitean" reading is to avail ourselves of far less radical ways of understanding Heraclitus' view or Nietzsche's indebtedness to it. Meyer is clearly aware of such readings, but a regular feature of his treatment of the various sources he engages throughout this book is the dismissal, often without argument, of plausible, often more reasonable, alternative readings. Buried in a footnote, for instance, we find that, "There is some variation on the Heraclitean position. It can also be read as the view that everything is in motion. However, I argue that the best reading of the position, at least for my purposes, is the one stated above, i.e., that everything is motion" (p. 159n351). In another instance, Meyer admits at a pivotal point in his reading of HH §1 that

the passage itself does not directly indicate that the rejection of Parmenidean being and the acceptance of Heraclitean becoming are at stake. Indeed, one could defend a more deflationary reading of the section by arguing that Nietzsche simply wants to highlight the fact that something like rationality emerged or evolved from irrationality and therefore deny that anything like reason could entirely free itself from irrational drives. (p. 136)

But Meyer dismisses this reading because, as mentioned above, a notebook fragment written some years later sounds closer to his view.

So, too, with Meyer's take on Nietzsche's "perspectivism," which he interprets in the most radical way possible, as the view that we, as "active and interpretive forces are responsible for creating the objects of perception and so perspectival knowledge" (p. 218, emphasis added). Now, most scholars take Nietzsche's references to the perspectival nature of knowing to indicate little more than that knowledge is always situated. Meyer calls this deflationary interpretation "the point of view reading," and he concedes that Genealogy III §12 -- the locus classicus of many analyses of perspectivism and one of the few published passages in which Nietzsche even uses the relevant term -- supports it. But he cannot accept this evidence, because "it will conflict with . . . the relational ontology [Nietzsche] articulates throughout his works" (p. 218). If there are reasons for setting aside Genealogy III §12 and the more modest reading of it other than a prior commitment to his interpretation, Meyer does not make them clear. Instead, he insists that what Nietzsche really means in this passage is revealed only in the posthumously assembled and fragmentary collection, The Will to Power (pp. 219-20).

On the one hand, readers who do see in Nietzsche's praise of Heraclitus the vestiges of an ontology will be sympathetic at least to Meyer's general interpretive approach. And there have been many such readers. In fact, Meyer admits,

if there is any novelty to my efforts here, it is the extent to which I pursue these claims by tracing Nietzsche's rejection of the metaphysical tradition back to Plato's Theaetetus and Aristotle's Metaphysics and the way in which I use these ancient texts to resolve some of the philosophical difficulties that Nietzsche's positions have generated. (p. 25)

But the chapters that undertake this exercise rely heavily on other scholars' readings of the ancient texts and make no case that Nietzsche saw the solutions proposed therein, or even appreciated the need for such solutions or would have looked for them in these texts.[9] Thus, Meyer's work here remains largely ineffective as a line of defense against the many challenges that come with reading Nietzsche in this way; sympathy notwithstanding, then, even these readers will not find new reasons to pick up such a line of interpretation or new resources for defending it. And on the other hand, Meyer simply has no truck with those who might be skeptical about the Heraclitean commitments and overarching ontological concerns he finds in Nietzsche's philosophy; their "neglect," as he puts it (p. 28), and "lack of attention to Nietzsche's Heracliteanism" are reason enough not to engage them at length. That is to say, Meyer never takes seriously the idea that a reading that does not engage Heraclitus primarily can be a competing interpretation of Nietzsche's work.

In his Epilogue and Appendix, Meyer has one more suggestive thing to say in favor of the priority he accords HH and BGE and the role of "Nietzsche's Heracliteanism" in his philosophy. In the appendix, specifically, he offers a new, non-chronological "periodization" of Nietzsche's works (pp. 277-78), according to which these two books would form "the beginning of two series of works that both culminate in a tragedy and comedy, respectively" (p. 276; see also p. 265). They are, in other words, important points along a narrative arc, initiated with The Birth of Tragedy (1872), that achieves architectonic perfection in the writings of Nietzsche's brief and final productive period (1888), when as a Dionysian poet "Nietzsche makes his own music" (p. 22). This vision seems to us to require that Nietzsche aimed, almost from the beginning of his career, to make his last works his last works -- a grand finale in the style of the Old Comedy (p. 23; see also p. 131). But that Nietzsche's productive career was lamentably and abruptly cut short by a mental collapse he could not have foreseen almost twenty years earlier makes this a very difficult framing narrative to accept. At any rate, too little is said in its defense (as Meyer himself grants on p. 265); and yet, since it appears to be inspiring Meyer's approach to Nietzsche's texts, and thus the "Heraclitean" reading to which this book is devoted, too much is riding on it.

In this and other respects, readers should be cautioned that Meyer's Nietzsche inhabits a closed system in the classical sense; its laws are forbidding, the territory hostile, and the journey through it unlikely to be a pleasant one.

[1] Meyer also accords a substantial role to the sophist Protagoras of Abdera. Although we will not be able to unpack them here, we have concerns about his reading of Protagoras that parallel those about Heraclitus, which we discuss below.

[2] For a discussion, see pp. 91-98 of Jessica N. Berry, "Nietzsche and the Greeks" in The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche, ed. John Richardson and Ken Gemes (Oxford University Press, 2013): 83-107. Or see Daniel W. Graham, "Heraclitus: Flux, Order, and Knowledge" in The Oxford Handbook of Presocratic Philosophy, ed. Patricia Curd and Daniel W. Graham (Oxford University Press, 2008): 169–88, in which Graham argues briefly but compellingly against the central features of the view Meyer attributes to Nietzsche: e.g., "Although we might have expected an account of change in which the world is radically fragmented, we find considerable continuity in Heraclitus' world" (p. 171). And, "It has recently been claimed that these words [frag. DK B88] reveal Heraclitus' identification of opposites. But they do nothing of the sort" (p. 175). Cf. Meyer, p. 6n27.

[3] Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, trans. Marianne Cowan (Regnery Publishing Inc., 1962); see pp. 50-52.

[4] Readers familiar with Maudemarie Clark's Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1990) will recognize the term, but perhaps not Meyer's use of it. He devotes a good deal of discussion to this thesis, in the spirit of helping "commentators like Clark [who] have had a difficult time reconciling it with [Nietzsche's] empiricism and his positive attitude toward the natural sciences" (p. 118), but we find only in a footnote the important qualification that "my own definition of the falsification thesis differs from Clark's" (p. 119n278).

[5] Nietzsche hardly figures in the second and fourth chapters, where Meyer's painstakingly close readings of passages from Aristotle's Metaphysics and Plato's Theaetetus appear to serve little point beyond saving Meyer's Heraclitean Nietzsche from himself. We return to these issues below.

[6] Meyer sometimes concedes that value, not ontology, is what's at stake in these texts, and he is cognizant of the objection that his interpretation, e.g., "reads too much into BGE §2" (p. 223). His response is simply to insist that Nietzsche is doing more than meets the eye, which we'll see if we look to the Nachlass. This, of course, further underscores the extent to which Meyer's commitment to the priority principle is in word only--the Heraclitean themes are simply invisible unless we look to the Nachlass.

[7] As, indeed, we can see in BGE §2, where Nietzsche parodies "the fundamental belief of metaphysicians"--namely, "the belief in oppositions of values." Against these philosophers, who pledge to examine all things critically, but who in fact never subject this belief to scrutiny, Nietzsche says, "we can doubt, first, whether opposites even exist and, second, whether the popular valuations and value oppositions that have earned the metaphysicians' seal of approval might not only be foreground appraisals" (emphasis added). But his throwing down the skeptical gauntlet in this passage falls far short of a declaration of the radically insubstantial and relative nature of the physical world. Nietzsche's focus in this passage is on moral evaluation. Intending to expose the tenacious unwillingness of philosophers to concede that what we deem "higher" might come from what is "lower," he has an imaginary "metaphysician" say: "How could anything originate out of its opposite? Truth from error, for instance? Or the will to truth from the will to deception? Or selfless action from self-interest? Or the pure, sun-bright gaze of wisdom from a covetous leer? Such origins are impossible, and people who dream about such things are fools--at best. Things of the highest value must have another, separate origin of their own" (BGE §2). Their conclusion, contentiously won, licenses the next crucial step toward moral realism: if selfless action and self-interest, for instance, are opposites and nothing can come from its opposite, then we are free mendaciously to fabricate for them another origin, in something appropriately "higher," in a realm of eternal forms, or with God. Thus Nietzsche exposes one of many "prejudices of philosophers" to which the first book of BGE is dedicated.

[8] As, e.g., Bernard Reginster does in "The Paradox of Perspectivism" in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62 (2001): 217-33; quoted in Meyer, p. 217.

[9] Meyer concedes as much: "I do want to note that the primary point of this exercise is not to identify the historical influences on Nietzsche's thought or to argue that Nietzsche is consciously reviving views he finds in Plato's works." Instead, his detailed explorations are meant to provide only "a resource for reflecting on the various philosophical challenges that confront Nietzsche in adopting this view" (p. 158).