Reading Seneca: Stoic Philosophy at Rome

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Brad Inwood, Reading Seneca: Stoic Philosophy at Rome, Oxford University Press, 2005, 392pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199250898.

Reviewed by Katja Maria Vogt, Columbia University


Reading Seneca, a collection of twelve papers (ten of which have been previously published) plus an introduction, will prove highly valuable even for those who have followed Inwood's work on Seneca over the years. Taken together, Inwood's papers make an impressive statement. Seneca emerges as a subtle and original Stoic philosopher, and, perhaps most importantly, a thinker who makes a distinctive contribution to moral psychology, and to what we might describe as the study of the human mind. Inwood identifies a range of questions which are of great interest to contemporary philosophers, and he makes a persuasive case for Seneca's thought on these questions being very much worth our attention.

Inwood explicitly states that he only addresses Seneca's philosophy (1). But can one read any of Seneca's work as philosophy only? Is Seneca not always, even when he philosophizes, at the same time a man of letters (and more)? Inwood proposes -- and I think convincingly -- that one can be fully aware of the literary side of Seneca's prose, and still choose to engage with what one finds philosophically most exciting in it. In spite of the fact that Inwood offers much more (see, most importantly, the first paper of the volume, 'Seneca in his Philosophical Milieu'), his study is most distinctive in portraying Seneca as an original philosopher. This is particularly useful because Seneca is often quite difficult to appreciate as a philosopher. As Inwood suggests, Seneca's "literary genius and bravado" might not only not facilitate philosophical engagement with his writings, but actually make it more difficult (5). Inwood begins his book with a refreshingly frank statement: at the outset of his long-term project on Seneca, he expected to detect "a coherent general picture of Seneca's philosophical methods and commitments". But, he continues, after fifteen years of very close study, "such a general picture (if indeed there is one lurking in the rich tapestry of Seneca's prose works) has not yet emerged" (2). However, this does not mean that Seneca is not worthy of our philosophical interest. Inwood concludes that Seneca's "philosophical ingenium probably worked itself out in a fundamentally particularistic way as he pursued aspects of Stoicism that engaged him most forcefully over the course of a long and active life as a writer" (3). Inwood's discussions of these issues bring out the depth and detail of Seneca's thought, and thus outline a way of appreciating him as a philosopher.

Seneca scholars have traditionally been interested in various Latin terms in Seneca which do not map easily onto Greek Stoic terminology, a prime example of which is the notion voluntas. More recently, scholars have been fascinated by the role that Seneca may play in the development of a modern conception of the self. But how should we approach such questions as whether Seneca invents (or discovers) the will, or the self? In 'The Will in Seneca' [5] and in 'Seneca and Self-Assertion' [12], Inwood offers, I think, a very fruitful methodological alternative to what he calls a lexical approach (which studies individual instances of key terms). According to Inwood, it is through detailed interpretation of Seneca's views about certain philosophical questions that we can better understand Seneca's contribution to the history of the conceptions of both the will and the self -- questions relating to intentions, desire, self-control, and moral improvement. It is by this method that Inwood arrives at his verdicts: Seneca invents neither the will nor the soul.

In the more recent and previously unpublished paper on the self [12], Inwood responds in detail to a line of interpretation which is associated with Foucault, and which ascribes a vital role within the development of a modern notion of the self to Seneca. Inwood's main consideration, that the impression that Seneca is concerned with novel entities is created by Seneca's interest in the 'reflexive nature of moral self-improvement' (323), offers an important alternative to these interpretations. Inwood adds to this point in a rather provocative way: What we find in Seneca's writings is Seneca himself, rather than 'the self'. According to Inwood, part of the reason why there is so much 'self' in Seneca's writings is because Seneca occasionally dramatizes his discussions by speaking from his own experience. The prominence of Seneca in his own writings may, at times, even be due to the need to assert himself as an "independent thinker" (352).

In 'Seneca and Psychological Dualism' [2], Inwood is concerned with another aspect of Seneca's contribution to moral psychology. According to Inwood, Seneca's study of the emotions is basically in agreement with early Stoic psychology, but it is not a mere rehearsal of earlier arguments. Seneca shifts, to some extent, the focus. He broadens the perspective to consider a range of phenomena that in some sense fall below the threshold of being genuine emotions -- phenomena as varied as shivering, vegetative functions of the body, vertigo, and emotional responses to art. What binds these phenomena (and others) together is that they do not involve our endorsement, are not set off by conscious approval, and are not strictly speaking subject to moral praise or blame. In 'Moral Judgement in Seneca' [7], Inwood studies Seneca's philosophical and metaphorical use of the language of judging. One of many interesting observations that Inwood makes points to a relationship between Stoic thought on the emotions and on decision-making: Like a judge, we should calmly consider all options, not being carried away, and in full control of ourselves.

In 'Politics and Paradox in Seneca's De Beneficiis' [3], Inwood argues that Seneca analyzes the social practice of the giving and receiving of 'good deeds' (Inwood's rendition of beneficia) by distinguishing between the actual giving and repaying, and the intention to give and repay. Insofar as the agent's intention is ethically more important than her actions, the giving and repaying of beneficia can be seen as an exchange between minds, and for that reason Seneca can defend what he calls a Stoic paradox: that to accept a beneficium gladly is to have repaid it (Ben. II.31.1). But as Inwood makes clear, Seneca also engages with the -- paradoxical -- early Stoic claim that only the wise benefit and are benefited. That he does so, however, in my view makes the interpretation of De Beneficiis difficult in a fundamental way. The social practice of beneficia is concerned with what the Stoics call indifferents -- money, positions, etc. But benefiting and being benefited are in no way confined to other-related actions in which indifferents are given or received. If a sage moves his finger virtuously, all other sages in the world are benefited. Indeed, against the background of earlier Stoic philosophy, the very notion of beneficia is puzzling. Is Seneca working with a notion which, at some points, refers to favors, but at other points, to genuine instances of virtue? Seneca is certainly aware of the difference (in V.13.1, he calls favors beneficiis similia; however, for the most part, he uses beneficia for favors in the conventional sense), and Inwood's paper makes major strides towards clarifying how the Stoic paradox that only the sage can benefit and be benefited figures in Seneca's discussion. But I am not sure whether, in the end, Seneca's discussions of beneficia are not more independent from earlier Greek discussions than Inwood suggests, partly because the notion beneficia has no real counterpart in Greek Stoicism. Beneficium, literally 'benefaction', is ambivalent and suggestive in a way that is particularly relevant to Seneca's discussion: it might be taken to refer to genuinely virtuous action ('good deed'), but it can also refer to a social practice of giving and receiving 'favors'.

In 'God and Human Knowledge in Seneca's Natural Questions' [6], Inwood addresses the question why the Quaestiones Naturales, a treatise on meteorology, is (for many readers) so difficult to appreciate. According to Inwood, Seneca is ultimately concerned with the divine nature of the cosmos, the relationship between humans and gods, and the limitations of human beings. But Seneca chooses to make his points through the study of meteorology. His reason, according to Inwood, is that this presents a literary challenge, a challenge that, as he suggests, Seneca may fail to meet. Inwood's assessment of Seneca's literary ambitions and possible failing is bound to incite controversy. But it seems that, independently of whether one agrees with him on this point, Inwood's essay on the Natural Questions is a very helpful guide to the overall philosophical concerns of the treatise.

Like [6], 'Reason, Rationalization, and Happiness' [9] contributes to the understanding of Seneca's engagement with physics. Especially the later Stoics seem to be preoccupied with therapy, and we may wonder whether their talk about fate is strategic: Do they ask us to see adversity as fate because this will make us feel better? Inwood persuasively argues that for Seneca, just as for the early Stoics, no ad hoc reframing of our beliefs is involved in the acceptance of fate. We are not invited to consider slavery or illness as indifferent once we are enslaved or ill. Rather, Seneca and the early Stoics fully endorse the general thesis that such things, no matter what our present circumstances are, are indifferent, and that we need a complete understanding of nature in order to be able to comprehend this and thus embrace fate.

In 'Getting to Goodness' [10], Inwood turns to a core difficulty in Stoic ethics. How do we acquire the concept of the good? According to Inwood, the Stoics think that concept-formation depends on "sensory experience, interpreted broadly" (271). But only virtue is good, and we are likely never to meet a sage, i.e., someone through whom, once we had encountered him or her, we would experience the good. As Inwood argues, Seneca offers a solution to this problem: We observe imperfect but laudable agents; nature makes us amplify their virtue; we thus arrive at a notion of perfect goodness without actually experiencing it; this process is further aided by an ideal of a perfect agent (such as an idealized picture of Socrates). Essay [10] is a recent and previously unpublished contribution to the scholarship on the Stoic conception of the good, and it is, in my view, bound to become a major point of reference for further research. Seneca, as Inwood says, assumes that we all have the concept of the good. He asks, as it were, how did we come to acquire it, not how someone might come to acquire it. But most people consider things which the Stoics say are indifferent to be genuinely good (or bad). It is unclear whether such beliefs would count as giving us a conception of the good. In assuming that we all have the concept of the good, Seneca may not be addressing quite the same question as earlier Stoics when they discuss the acquisition of the concept of the good. Inwood indicates that it is at some points unclear whether Seneca talks about the concept of the good, or the concept of a happy life (290). This lack of clarity might be relevant to the way in which Seneca addresses his own question: It could plausibly be thought that those who are not virtuous have a notion of a happy life and of virtue as an ideal, but not -- on early Stoic assumptions -- the concept of the genuinely good.

Both 'Rules and Reasoning in Stoic Ethics' [4] and 'Natural Law in Seneca' [8] engage with the question of how we should interpret the Stoic notion of natural law. In [4], Inwood takes up the question of whether, for the early Stoics, this law breaks down into rules. As Inwood argues, we do not find universal rules in Stoic ethics. What we find are defeasible, general rules, and these are "constraining rules" or "generally stable guidelines for ordinary decision-makers"; sages can set aside rules (110). If we only consider the ideal decision-maker, i.e., the sage, the law turns out to be identical with the prescriptive force of whatever choice he makes on a given occasion (97). In [8], Inwood argues that Seneca moves away from the early notion of the natural law which, as we saw, is primarily concerned with practical reasoning. Seneca speaks in several ways of the natural law, identifying the law mostly with 'facts of life' like mortality. In the latter part of [8], Inwood makes an intriguing suggestion: Seneca, according to this proposal, construes our relationship to the natural law similarly to the way in which Socrates, in Plato's Crito, describes his relationship to Athenian law. Anyone would choose to be born, just like Socrates sees himself as having chosen to live in Athens. Since we would choose to be born, we should think of ourselves as having accepted the natural law, interpreted, at this point, as the overall causal nexus which at times inflicts hardships on human beings. Since we have entered into this agreement, it is now rational to accept its downsides, accepting adversity just as Socrates accepts his death-sentence -- as part of an overall agreement. Among the various ways in which Seneca speaks of natural law, Inwood pays special attention to how, for Seneca, the fact that death is part of human life can be described as a part of the natural law. Both in this discussion, and in 'Seneca on Freedom and Autonomy' [11], Inwood explores how reflection on death is central to Seneca's ethics. As Inwood convincingly argues, the option to leave life (and our bodies) by committing suicide is, for Seneca, integral to our agency. By choosing suicide, the sage chooses to remain a full agent, leaving life before his or her powers of agency deteriorate.

Needless to say, my brief account of Inwood's essays is selective, and even more so the few points which I have chosen to highlight or discuss. Each paper is rich in detail and likely to generate scholarly debate. By way of conclusion, let me return to what I take to be the main effect of publishing this series of papers as a book. Inwood's methodological commitments become very clear. Inwood does not aim to give a complete picture of Seneca as a writer. He is interested in those aspects of Seneca's thought that are most technical, and in the philosophical arguments which Seneca offers for his views. He suggests that we follow Seneca's philosophical path, which, as Inwood suggests, is deeply particularistic. We must understand how Seneca frames his own questions, and how the questions he is specifically interested in are interrelated, in order then to arrive at views on such issues as whether Seneca invents the will, discovers the self, or develops further the early Stoic notion of the natural law. Inwood's method leads away not only from what he calls a 'lexical approach', but also from source criticism of a traditional kind. As a result, Inwood's book offers more than several highly engaging discussions that are of great interest for the study of Stoic philosophy. Inwood proposes a method for coming to terms with Seneca's philosophy, and, in my view, provides a very valuable guide to enjoying Seneca philosophically.