Real Ethics: Reconsidering the Foundations of Morality

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Rist, John M., Real Ethics: Reconsidering the Foundations of Morality, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 303 pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00608-2.

Reviewed by Lawrence C. Becker, College of William and Mary (emeritus)


This book is an attempt to rehabilitate realist ethics in the Platonic tradition—that is to say, in the tradition in which a transcendent moral reality (of good, perhaps, or of right, or of virtue, or of God) provides the metaphysical underpinning for morality. In this effort, at least in the part of it that gets onto the page, Rist is not seriously interested in moral realism of a nontranscendent sort, and even less in moral realism based on nontranscendent, nonmoral facts. He apparently believes that the history of ethical theories of these sorts shows that all such efforts will fail, but that the similar lack of success of Platonic alternatives is no obstacle to thinking that they might eventually succeed. More directly, what he says is that “if Plato is fundamentally right about transcendental moral realism, any ‘modern’ reconstruction of ethics [without such metaphysical foundations] must reduce to some form of ‘choice theory’, tied to relativism or perspectivism [of the sort crudely represented by Thrasymachus].” (8) This, he thinks, is insupportable. Rist says of his book that

[f]or all its ancient material, [it] is offered as a book about ethics and politics, not about the history of philosophy. Only it is futile to expect to do ethics if we refuse to remember what we have been taught…. Thus this book is also intended to further the process of setting straight the historical record and returning us, chastened, to earlier and more promising journeyings. (8)

He thinks we are now in a spiritual, moral, and political crisis – in part due to philosophical waywardness – and that Plato shows us the way out.

In Chapters 1 and 2, Rist argues for a particular interpretation of the Republic. He says “[Plato’s project in the Republic] is to show – and it is also my project here – that a position roughly similar to that of Thrasymachus is one of only two coherent attitudes to the first principles of ‘morality’…” (17), and that since we must discard the Thrasymachus option, we must embrace the other one – namely, Plato’s own. This is an interesting interpretive thesis, and specialists in ancient philosophy will want to examine it closely. At first sight, it does seem a stretch to construe this as the “main point” of the Republic, and the footnotes imply that the author has had some dispute with other historians of ancient philosophy on these matters. Rist’s argument for his interpretation of Plato is, fairly enough, a description of the text designed to bring out the points favoring his thesis.

More interesting to ethical theorists is the question of whether Plato’s own position or some descendant of it is credible as a piece of moral philosophy. Rist is candid about the defects of the original version, and does not spend much time trying to salvage that. Rather, in Chapter 2 and beyond, Rist shifts from Plato himself to later versions of theistic Platonism, which he regards as internally more coherent. Still, the fact that a view is internally coherent is hardly a compelling reason for adopting it. In this case, one needs either a line of argument directly in support of metaphysical moral realism, or an argument by elimination to show that there is something fatally wrong with all the competing views (together with the principle of excluded middle). Rist offers arguments of both sorts.

His argument by elimination, begun in the last half of Chapter 2 with a series of objections to Epicurus, Hobbes, and others, but pursued throughout the book, is designed to show that a representative sample of alternatives to realism all ultimately reduce to a form of “free-floating” radical choice, equivalent to the position Plato put in the mouth of Thrasymachus and discredited. There are, however, some problems with Rist’s sample. It is not surprising to find that he has an easy time supporting his thesis with Kierkegaard, Sartre, and some 20th-century noncognitivists. But in my view he is less successful with Epicurus, Hobbes, and indeed any theory that includes the premise that human nature and the human condition constrain choice. If rational choice is so constrained that it rules out moral nihilism and most of the things that we conventionally regard as evil, and if we have independent, nonmoral reasons for being rational, then there is little force to Rist’s sweeping objection to non-Platonic alternatives. This is surely a productive way to interpret social contract theory from Hobbes onward through Rawls to Scanlon. It also characterizes rational choice theorists working with the notion of bounded rationality, e.g., Russell Hardin. None of this is addressed. Moreover, it seems odd to me that rationalists other than Kant are barely mentioned, since one would think they all have a direct line of descent from Plato, and one has reason to doubt that objections to Kant would suffice for all of them.

Rist’s arguments directly in support of metaphysical moral realism are more difficult to find than his eliminative ones, even though endorsements of the position abound. Chapters 3 and 4 are instructive in this regard. They are designed to argue that without realism we do not have the resources needed for a good life. More specifically, he argues that we cannot achieve the psychological unity and wholeness needed for a good life without the aid of external standards and ends (Chapter 3), and because (Chapter 4)

if we are divided, less than complete wholes, it follows that we stand in need of completion, and it is further possible that we are incomplete ‘externally’ as well as ‘internally’. By ‘external completeness’ I refer to a need for some external ‘addition’ or external ‘factor’ by which we may complete ourselves, with presumably an accompanying internal reintegration. By internal incompleteness I refer to my being a compound of less than integrated parts and therefore a less than functioning whole. The two forms of incompleteness are thus complementary, at least insofar as external completion promotes internal integration. (95)

In aid of these points, Rist does a striking job of assembling reminders of how typical it is for human beings to lack psychological unity in their values and purposes, to lack self-knowledge, to be adrift on a sea of possibilities, and to hunger for some sort of unifying force from the outside (love, immersion in political life, God). To some, that might suggest the thesis that we lack the possibility of constructing, out of our own resources, a robust form of moral unity and agency. Rist repeatedly asserts as much. But even if that is so (and I for one deny it), we should notice that this deficiency does nothing to show that it is possible for some external source to supply the resources that would remedy those problems. That is a crucial step in the argument Rist wants to make, and it is hard to find a convincing, or even developed, argument for this further thesis in the book.

In Chapters 3 and 4, for example, Rist floats the idea that we can’t look to accounts of human nature to supply moral unity and identity, and supports this with a few pages critical of Aristotle for ignoring the identity question, a broadside against the Stoics, and more. He holds out hope that love might provide the unifying force (108), and repeatedly recommends exploring theism for this purpose. None of this, however, contributes much in the way of affirmative argument for metaphysical moral realism, because it doesn’t give us any reason to believe that we could get such a theory settled in a way that would not be undermined almost immediately by doubt and disagreement. Surely reflective religious people, for example, when they consider the perpetual, excruciating divisions among the world’s religions, and the consequent strife promoted by them, must have serious doubts about the prospect for a theistic solution to the problem – one that can realistically provide us all with the moral unity we crave. Moreover, the power of human reflection to undermine the normative authority of whatever is “given” or laid down by an external source is surely as persistent and effective as the processes that undermine psychological unity and agency. What we need is some reason to believe that beliefs about transcendental moral realities could be a stable solution to the problems Rist describes. Chapter 5, on “rules and applications,” rehearses additional difficulties for ethical theory, but adds nothing to the affirmative side of the argument.

The remaining chapters, through their commentary on philosophers and natural law theologians, add to the perplexity. On the one hand, their wide-ranging assembly of the difficulties and deficiencies of non-theistic ethics is often impressive. (It’s also often irritating, when one’s favorites are ignored or slighted. And this may be as good a place as any to warn the reader that one of the least attractive features of the book is its general grumpiness about contemporary philosophy and politics – ranging from persistent pique at the neglect of transcendental moral realism among contemporary Anglo-American philosophers of a secular persuasion to exasperation at political responses to the problems of multiculturalism in Canada and the United States. In between these poles are swipes at political liberalism, individualism, and democratic theory, mixed in with dismissive remarks about various significant figures in recent philosophy. None of this serves the argument well.) On the other hand, one cannot avoid the thought that there is something seriously unfair about the approach. Two things, actually.

One is the frequency of dubious bifurcations, used unhelpfully to dismiss alternatives to metaphysical realism. The most blatant one is the persistent claim there are, at bottom, only two alternatives in moral theory, transcendental moral realism and radical choice. As I have indicated above, is plausible to think that there are other alternatives that Rist does not seriously consider.

The second unfairness comes from a double standard in assessing theories. The work of one major philosopher after another is brought up for discussion, characterized quickly, criticized for some serious difficulty, and dismissed. Transcendent moral realism is offered as an alternative, but not subjected to anything approaching the same standard. Granted, the task Rist has undertaken here is to argue for the value of rehabilitating a neglected sort of theory; he has not set out to produce a developed theory of that sort. Nonetheless, by any standard of comparison comparable to the one he uses on theories he dismisses, transcendent moral realism must itself be dismissed. This is so because we have not been given, or referred to, a plausible sketch of how such a transcendent moral reality might be accessible to human knowledge—accessible in a way that allows us to distinguish knowledge from true opinion, or even to distinguish knowledge from mere belief. Without some resolution of this epistemological difficulty, transcendent moral realism is a nonstarter, no matter how flawed the alternatives to it might be.