Real Materialism and Other Essays

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Galen Strawson, Real Materialism and Other Essays, Oxford UP, 2008, 478pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199267439.

Reviewed by Andrew Melnyk, University of Missouri



Nineteen previously published papers, with an introduction, make up Galen Strawson’s latest book; nearly all of them have been revised for republication only lightly or not at all. They address an impressively broad range of philosophical topics: the place of mind in the physical world, knowledge of the world in itself, color and color vocabulary, self-consciousness, conscious experiences, conceptions of oneself, intentionality in relation to conscious experience, freewill, causation, and Hume on causation. The papers are not all parts of a grand philosophical design, though they are thematically related to one another in various ways. The most important connecting thread is Strawson’s endorsement of what he calls realistic materialism, which, despite its name, actually denies the conventional materialism or physicalism that is widely, though by no means universally, assumed in current philosophy of mind. Perhaps half the book either defends realistic materialism or addresses issues in the philosophy of mind within the framework that it provides. The main appeal of the book, in my view, lies in the lively and undoubtedly intelligent contrarianism of its author, who provides abundant challenges to widely-held views, especially in the philosophy of mind, and in his large philosophical ambitions. He seems to me, for instance, to want to re-make contemporary philosophy of mind from scratch.

Alas, I have significant general misgivings about the book. There is needless repetition both within and across papers, even while key positions and moves are never made really clear. The book is bloated with material that should have been eliminated or ruthlessly condensed, but which was apparently included on the principle that no thought should ever go to waste. Relevant contemporary literature — I noticed this especially in the papers in the philosophy of mind — is either ignored or discussed in such general terms that it might as well have been ignored (e.g., Joe Levine’s work, the literature on representationalism, or Ruth Millikan’s work on intentionality). Rarely does the book engage in detail with the arguments of individual opponents, opponents being more likely to make an appearance, and to be dispatched, collectively. There is nothing like enough careful argumentation; indeed, Strawson’s official line is that tight arguments are over-rated (3). There is, however, a good amount of very feeble argumentation. One example: in “Real Intentionality: Why Intentionality Entails Consciousness”, Strawson objects to the view that “we need a survival-and-well-being-based normative notion of function in order to make sense of the notion of misrepresentation” as follows:

This cannot be right, for there is … no incoherence in the idea of a Pure Observer who can represent and misrepresent, and know it, in a way completely unconnected with any such notion of function. (288; emphasis in original)

As it stands, however, Strawson’s objection fails — and for a familiar reason. By saying that there is “no incoherence in the idea of a Pure Observer”, Strawson clearly means that his Pure Observer is conceivable in the sense of violating no a priori semantic constraints on the concept of representation. Those who advance the view targeted by Strawson’s objection (e.g., Millikan), however, explicitly present their view not as an analysis of the concept of representation that can be evaluated a priori by appeal to what is conceivable but instead as an a posteriori identity hypothesis as to what representation turns out to be. Indeed, they mustn’t present their view of representation as a conceptual analysis, for, given their view of what representation is, representations in general, and hence concepts, and hence the concept of representation in particular don’t have semantic analyses. The passage in which this unsuccessful objection occurs is not the only occasion on which Strawson makes what, in the current state of debate, will strike many as a very naïve use of the method of possible cases.

Despite these defects, the book still contains some very good material. I was fully persuaded, for example, by the paper arguing that Hume never held a regularity theory of causation (“David Hume: Objects and Power”), and I much enjoyed “The Impossibility of Ultimate Moral Responsibility”, as well as the acute discussion (in “Consciousness, Free Will, and the Unimportance of Determinism”) of whether it matters if determinism is true.

I was much less impressed with the work in the philosophy of mind, partly because it operates within the framework of Strawson’s realistic materialism, which I find to be an unsatisfactory basis for a philosophical research program — for reasons that I will now explain. Realistic materialism is presented in the first two papers of the book, the title essay “Real Materialism” and “Realistic Monism: Why Physicalism Entails Panpsychism”, and is a view of the place of the qualitative character of experiences in the wider world.1 As I understand it, it comprises five claims:

1) Experiential phenomena are perfectly real.

2) Experiential phenomena are such that:

(i) they’re “part of fundamental reality” (35);

(ii) we know them to exist with certainty (23);

(iii) in having experience, “we are directly acquainted with certain features of the ultimate nature of reality” (25, 41);

(iv) “the having [of them] is the knowing” (25);

(v) “we can’t be radically in error about [their] nature” (55, note 7).

3) Not “all aspects” of experiential phenomena “can be described by current physics, or some non-revolutionary extension of it” (22).

4) Still, experiential phenomena are “physical in every respect” (23, 35, 37).

How can claim 4 and claim 3 be consistent? According to Strawson, we need (a) to distinguish between structural physical features and intrinsic physical features and (b) to adopt the epistemologically structuralist view that physics only gives us knowledge of the world’s structural features. Given (a) and (b), claim 3 is true if the qualitative character of an experience is not a structural physical feature of the world. Claim 4 can be true too, however, if, as Strawson holds:

5) The qualitative character of an experience is an intrinsic physical feature of the event of neurons firing (22, 37).

Real materialism, I should note, is not a novel position; as Strawson acknowledges, it is essentially the position proposed by Grover Maxwell in 1978 (51, note 126). Both are inspired by Russell, of course.

Claim 3 is a very strong claim, entailing the falsehood of every kind of conventional (non-eliminative) physicalism about experiential phenomena. Why should we accept claim 3, according to Strawson? Why, for example, should we disbelieve the type-identity view that phenomenal properties form a proper subset of neurophysiological properties? One might have expected Strawson to endorse familiar arguments for property dualism, e.g., Jackson’s knowledge argument or Kripke’s appeal to the necessity of identity, since, though they don’t establish that the qualitative characters of experience fail to be intrinsic physical features, they do (if successful) establish that they fail to be structural physical features. In fact, however, he doesn’t endorse these arguments, at least explicitly.2 His official argument for claim 3 is that its negation amounts to eliminativism about experiential phenomena, which “is mad” (22).3 That the negation of claim 3 amounts to eliminativism is said to follow “from the fact that current physics contains no predicates for experiential phenomena at all, and that no non-revolutionary extension of it could do so” (22, note 17; 56, note 9). Unfortunately, Strawson doesn’t here say how he knows this putative fact. In particular, he doesn’t say why he feels entitled to rule out the possibility that, exactly as type-identity physicalists suppose, certain immensely complex predicates from current physics in fact pick out the qualitative characters of experiential phenomena, even though this can’t be discovered a priori.4 I conjecture, however, that one way he thinks he can rule out this possibility is by attending introspectively to his own experience (54-55, note 6). For, in his Introduction, he characterizes phenomenal properties as "properties whose whole and essential nature can be and is fully revealed in sensory experience" (12; my emphases). If this characterization of phenomenal properties is correct, then no phenomenal property can be such that some scientific term or concept picks out that very property in a way that represents more of the property’s essential nature, e.g., its internal structure, than is represented when we are directly acquainted with that property in experience.5 But a complex predicate from current physics that picked out a phenomenal property would represent a great deal of the property’s internal structure that goes unrepresented when we are acquainted with that property in experience. So no complex predicate from current physics can pick out a phenomenal property.

Presumably, Strawson means the first premise of this argument — that phenomenal properties are “properties whose whole and essential nature can be and is fully revealed in sensory experience” — to follow somehow from claim 2. However, he gives no reason, at least that I could find, for believing claim 2. Nevertheless we do need a reason; claim 2 is not forced upon us as claim 1 is. For even if, as Strawson holds, introspection assures us that experiential phenomena exist and hence that claim 1 is true, claim 2 goes much further: it purports to describe experiential phenomena in philosophically sophisticated metaphysical and epistemological terms. Since introspection has evolved by natural selection, as Strawson would allow, it’s unlikely to be capable of informing us directly of claim 2 — or indeed of any claim of comparable philosophical theoreticity. Perhaps claim 2 can be inferred from weaker claims about experience more plausibly regarded as direct deliverances of introspection; if so, however, this will need to be shown. The same points apply, of course, if claim 2 is expanded to include the claim that phenomenal properties are “properties whose whole and essential nature can be and is fully revealed in sensory experience”.

Philosophers who accept claims 1, 2, and 3 usually go on to endorse some sort of dualism, of course, treating the qualitative character of an experience as something entirely non-physical, as something not even supervening on or realized by the physical, but not Strawson. Instead, in claim 5, he treats the qualitative character of an experience as an intrinsic physical feature of a neural event. On what grounds? One rationale for claim 5 is that, given claim 1, it follows, more or less, from claims 3 and 4 (see 71). I have already discussed support for claim 3. What about claim 4? Much empirical evidence exists for claim 4, in my view, but it’s evidence that experiential phenomena are structural physical phenomena, something that claim 3 actually contradicts. I know of no evidence that experiential phenomena are intrinsic physical phenomena (given Strawson’s assumption of epistemological structuralism about physics). So supporting claim 4 is problematic for a realistic materialist. Strawson’s endorsement of claim 4 seems in fact to rest on his attraction to a unified view of the world, the idea presumably being that, given claim 4, all features of the world are unified in being physical, whether structural-physical or intrinsic-physical (51). Nevertheless Strawson insists that we have no grasp of “the essential nature of the physical”, so he can’t substantiate the idea that the intrinsic features of the world that are the qualitative characters of experiences share a genuine physicality with the structural features of the world that physics reveals (46). This first rationale for claim 5 therefore fails.

A second rationale for claim 5 appeals to ontological economy (50, 59, 66). I think it can be reconstructed as follows:

Structural physical features exist, but structural physical features can’t exist unless intrinsic physical features do too, so intrinsic physical features exist. The qualitative characters of experiences exist also, but, according to claim 3, they aren’t structural physical features. So either they’re identical with intrinsic physical features, as claim 5 says, or they’re entirely non-physical features. The former option — claim 5 — is more economical, and hence, other things being equal, to be preferred.

Strawson doesn’t argue that other things are in fact equal. Are they? I don’t know, though the answer would turn in part on the relative abilities of realistic materialism and its best dualist rival to explain puzzling features of the mind. I also note that this rationale for claim 5 uses the recently-contested premise that structural physical features require intrinsic physical features, i.e., that the physical world couldn’t be purely structural.6

The points made in the preceding paragraphs only partly explain why I’m not at all drawn to realistic materialism. There’s also the point that realistic materialism raises at least two inter-related questions to which, in its present form, it offers no answers. (i) According to Strawson, realistic materialism entails micropsychism, the view that “at least some ultimates are intrinsically experience-involving”, which he takes to imply that each ultimate involves a distinct subject of experience (71). Since human subjects of experience are not ultimates, and hence not the subjects of experience involved in ultimates, there must be some way in which the latter combine to form human subjects of experience. But how? Strawson raises this question himself, but he doesn’t try to answer it (72). This omission is serious, for so long as the question goes unanswered, realistic materialism hasn’t actually told us what my, or your, or any human subject’s experiencing of red is. Also, an answer to this question seems necessary for an answer to the second question. (ii) Realistic materialism, when joined with epistemological structuralism about physics, entails that we, i.e., human subjects of experience, can only know about the world’s structural features — except when we attend introspectively to the qualitative characters of our own experiences and thereby acquire knowledge of the intrinsic features of certain neural events in our own brains. But how is this supposed to work? Why does the epistemic handicap we labor under when we enquire scientifically disappear when instead we attend introspectively to our own experiences? What is it about introspection that gives it access to the intrinsic features of certain of our brain events? And why are the intrinsic features of only some, but not all, of our brain events accessible to introspection? These questions are not touched by realistic materialism in its present form.

A recurring theme in Strawson’s discussion of realistic materialism is that (i) we have no conception of what it is to be physical on the basis of which we might form any rational expectation at all that the mental couldn’t be physical and (ii) this point, though clearly appreciated in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, has been missed by contemporary students of the mind-body problem (e.g., 20, 38-40, 54). I entirely agree that we have no conception of physicality, if physicality is construed in Strawsonian fashion as a genuine property, a genuine meta-property, in fact, that is possessed by all physical properties (20). Nevertheless I strongly doubt that any student of the mind-body problem in the second half of the twentieth century has ever thought that we do have such a conception — a break with the past perhaps reflected in the terminological shift, to which Strawson attaches no importance, from “materialism” (and “matter”) to “physicalism”. Recent students formulate the mind-body problem in a way that doesn’t require a conception of physicality as a meta-property. They can do so because, unlike philosophers of earlier generations, they are able to draw upon the concrete achievements of the various branches of science over the past hundred years. Thus, pace Strawson, the mind-body problem today — our mind-body problem — is to understand how our everyday descriptions of ourselves as thinkers, feelers, and reasoners fits together with the extraordinarily rich scientific descriptions of ourselves provided by cognitive neuroscience, molecular biology, biochemistry, and, yes, even fundamental physics (54). Of course, these scientific descriptions probably don’t represent the last word, but so what? They don’t need to in order for the mind-body problem to be worth addressing. It’s interesting, at least to many of us, to contemplate our best scientific guesses as to the nature of the world and then speculate on how they hang together. Any detailed solution to the mind-body problem that we produce will naturally inherit the provisional and tentative character of the scientific descriptions with which the problem was formulated, but if scientists can tolerate fallibility, why not philosophers too?

1 And hence a view about intentional states, since Strawson holds that intentional states are experiential states.

2 He does give an argument that differs only terminologically from Joe Levine’s well known Explanatory Gap argument (63).

3 In his Introduction, Strawson compares deniers of phenomenal consciousness to psychiatric patients (6; and see note 31)!

4 On 54, note 3, he cites an argument from his own earlier work, but I won’t discuss it here.

5 Compare “element having atomic number 79” with “gold”, “NaCl” with “salt”, and so on.

6 See chs. 2 and 3 of James Ladyman and Don Ross, Every Thing Must Go: Metaphysics Naturalized (New York: Oxford University Press, 2007).