Reality and Its Structure: Essays in Fundamentality

Placeholder book cover

Ricki Bliss and Graham Priest (eds.), Reality and its Structure: Essays in Fundamentality, Oxford University Press, 2018, 324pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755630.

Reviewed by David Mark Kovacs, Tel Aviv University


Over the last ten years we have witnessed an explosion of research done in "stratified metaphysics", the area of metaphysics whose main focus is on concepts such as grounding, ontological dependence and fundamentality, and various first-order issues cast in terms of such notions. The present volume contains fifteen essays that fall within this broad research program, with one interesting twist to them: one way or other, they all question what has widely come to be recognized as the "orthodoxy" concerning the structure of reality.

What is the orthodoxy? In their helpful introduction, Ricki Bliss and Graham Priest formulate it as the conjunction of four theses:

1. The hierarchy thesis: Reality is hierarchically structured by metaphysical dependence relations that are anti-symmetric, transitive and anti-reflexive.

2. The fundamentality thesis: There is some thing(s) which is fundamental.

3. The contingency thesis: Whatever is fundamental is merely contingently existent.

4. The consistency thesis: The dependence structure has consistent structural properties. (2)

Accordingly, the book is organized into three parts: the seven essays in Part I question the Hierarchy Thesis; another six essays in Part II question the Fundamentality Thesis; and one paper each in Part III questions the Contingency Thesis and the Consistency Thesis, respectively.

There is a tricky issue about the proper formulation of the orthodoxy: different philosophers working in stratified metaphysics use different concepts to describe the structure of reality (e.g. some use grounding whereas other use ontological dependence), and these concepts are invoked to play overlapping but not quite identical theoretical roles. Bliss and Priest are aware of this difficulty and make the conscious decision largely to bracket it: when formulating the four pillars of the orthodoxy, they help themselves to fundamentality and a general notion of dependence and assume that the most important questions concerning the ultimate structure of reality won't turn on these conceptual decisions (4-5).

The decision not to differentiate sharply between ontological dependence and grounding has the advantage of not burdening first-order debates over the structure of reality with tedious conceptual distinctions that might ultimately prove irrelevant to the main issue. But it also has a major disadvantage: those who do draw the distinction will often be at a loss when trying to decide whether they count as friends or foes of particular components of the orthodoxy.[1] Indeed, the distinction might even have some bearing on whether Bliss and Priest's four theses capture a genuine orthodoxy. If we replace 'dependence' with 'grounding', they undoubtedly do. It's much less clear that they capture a genuine orthodoxy about ontological dependence, when that relation is understood in line with the specialized literature on this notion. Many theorists of ontological dependence don't merely deny irreflexivity but in fact assume without argument that ontological dependence is trivially reflexive and that everything ontologically depends on itself.[2] The status of the Fundamentality Thesis also becomes unobvious when understood as a thesis about ontological dependence, since it's far less common to assume that this relation bears systematic links to fundamentality than that grounding does (in the neo-Aristotelian tradition ontological independence has often been understood as a criterion of substancehood, but it's up for grabs whether substances are automatically fundamental according to most contemporary uses of the word 'fundamental'.)

My conceptual reservations aside, Bliss and Priest's introductory chapter does a nice job laying out the logical space of possible views regarding the first two (and to some extent, the fourth) tenets of what they define as the orthodoxy. Here, they map out the range of possible views according to four core principles regarding the structure of reality that one might accept or reject:

Anti-reflexivity: Nothing depends on itself.

Anti-symmetry: No things depend on each other.

Transitivity: Everything depends on anything a dependent depends on.

Extendability: Everything depends on something else.

As they note, there are sixteen ways in which these views could be combined, eleven of which are logically consistent. Another five views are inconsistent, though one who rejects the Consistency Thesis (an option they take seriously) might still endorse them.

As one can expect from a volume of this kind, the general tenor of most of the contributions, as well as the introduction, is skepticism about the orthodoxy. There is room for reasonable disagreement over how strong the case is for each element of the orthodoxy, and before concluding that most components of it are insufficiently supported, Bliss and Priest give most of them a fair hearing. For example, they consider a number of possible arguments for the Fundamentality Thesis, and I'm inclined to agree that none of them is decisive. (I think they are too quick to mark as "question-begging" arguments that are simply not particularly compelling, but this is a minor point of contention.) However, it seems to me that their discussion of the Hierarchy Thesis (and especially the Anti-reflexivity principle) could leave a newcomer to this literature with the impression that these are little more than uncritically endorsed dogmas. At least in the case of irreflexivity (and for this reason also the disjunction of transivitity and anti-symmetry, at least one of which would have to go if irreflexivity does), I hereby record my disagreement. In my view, the best reason for thinking that grounding is irreflexive has to do with a constraint on explanation: for any x, if x explains y then x needs to be able to convey some information that y doesn't itself convey. This argument for irreflexivity has been defended in detail by several authors, including Schnieder (2015), Guigon (2015) and myself (Kovacs 2018b). Bliss and Priest consider a similar argument in a couple of sentences (p. 14); Bliss devotes to it another couple of paragraphs in her contribution to the volume (p. 87). I will leave it to readers to decide if the argument has been adequately addressed.

Several of the contributors (e.g. Bliss, Daniel Nolan, and Naomi Thompson, Mark Jago and John Wigglesworth) follow Bliss and Priest's decision of not worrying too much about the distinction between grounding and ontological dependence. One important exception is Elizabeth Barnes' "Symmetric Dependence". In this insightful and quite convincing paper, Barnes argues -- by citing a number of substantive philosophical theses, for example an Aristotelian conception of universals and an Armstrong-inspired theory of states of affairs -- that ontological dependence isn't asymmetric, or that at the very least it shouldn't simply be assumed that it's asymmetric. But she is careful to emphasize that this result cannot be generalized to grounding and explanatory or priority-inducing relations. (In light of this, it is somewhat surprising that several authors in the volume nonetheless attempt to recruit her when defending revisionary conceptions of grounding.)

A few words about the other essays in Part I. Gabriel Oak Rabin explores how much of the orthodoxy could be relaxed consistently with grounding still serving as the relation in terms of which a "layered" conception of the world can be formulated. His answer is that most of the orthodoxy can indeed be preserved, since there is a conceptual gap between the orthodox view about the layered conception and orthodox view about grounding itself. The idea that reality comes in more and less fundamental layers, and that the former are in some way determined by the latter, can be formulated in terms of grounding even if grounding is a non-symmetric, non-reflexive and non-transitive relation.

In "Grounding and Reflexivity," Bliss criticizes the common assumption that grounding is irreflexive. She supports the possibility of self-grounding by intuitive counterexamples to irreflexivity, e.g. Kit Fine's puzzles of ground (more on these in a moment) and a counterexample due to Jenkins (2011): physicalism is the thesis that the mental is grounded in the physical; but surely the identity theory is a version of physicalism; so it is at least a conceptual possibility that mental states are both grounded in and identical to physical states. She then considers metaphysical, epistemological and explanatory objections to the possibility of circles of ground, deeming all of them inconclusive.

In "Cosmic Loops", Nolan considers the possibility of cosmic grounding loops, by which he means (roughly) the idea that the universe as a whole exhibits a circular grounding structure. (For example, in the Rucker Loop our universe is a sub-atomic part of a larger universe, which is itself a sub-atomic part of a larger universe, and so on; moreover, our cosmos is grounded in the larger cosmos it is part of, which in turn is grounded in the larger cosmos it is part of, and so on, until we finally get back to our own cosmos.) Nolan then argues that the possibility of cosmic loops can be kept consistent with grounding construed largely in line with the orthodoxy on a local scale: within each cosmic unit, grounding might still behave as if it was irreflexive, asymmetric and transitive.

Thompson ("Metaphysical Interdependence, Epistemic Coherentism, and Holistic Explanantion") attacks both the asymmetry and what she calls the "well-foundedness" of grounding: that for any x, x is either grounded by some foundational fact or facts, or is itself a foundational fact. She offers a few intuitive counterexamples to asymmetry (e.g. the truth teller: perhaps A = <B is true> and B = <A is true> are both true and ground each other; and perhaps each one of mass, density and volume are grounded in the other two) and argues that once we reject asymmetry, there will be theoretical space left for "metaphysical interdependence", which Thompson compares to epistemic coherentism about justification. She also discusses some problem cases for foundationalism (i.e. views that accept asymmetry and well-foundedness), argues that the interdependence view is well equipped to deal with them, and suggests that metaphysical interdependence supports a holistic type of explanation.

Priest's "Buddhist Dependence" is largely exploratory. It describes three Buddhist positions about metaphysical dependence (the Abidharma, the Madhayamaka and the Huayan schools) and argues that these are coherentist views that reject well-foundedness. He also points out some areas where Buddhist thought on metaphysical dependence could fruitfully inform contemporary debates.

Jon Erling Litland's "Bicollective Ground: Towards a (Hyper)Graphic Account" is an interesting development of the idea that grounding takes a plurality of facts not only on the side of the grounded but also on the side of the grounds -- an idea first defended, but not formally developed, by Dasgupta (2014). The paper first argues that Fine's truthmaker semantics isn't suitable to capture bicollective ground and then develops Litland's preferred hypergraphic account. Although largely technical in its orientation, the paper has important philosophical lessons. As Litland points out, a formally rigorous account of bicollective ground allows us to accept a view that is intuitively holistic, but it does so without giving up the formal principles that have been defining the orthodoxy. He also puts the account to use in making sense of a kind of mathematical structuralism.

One thing to note about Part I is that despite its focus on questioning the orthodoxy, none of the essays in it discusses in detail the kinds of cases that proponents of the orthodoxy are usually the most worried about. Most of these cases trace back to Fine's (himself an advocate of the orthodoxy) "Some Puzzles of Ground" (Fine 2010), which in the past few years produced a smaller sub-literature. One such puzzle goes as follows. Surely, there is a fact to the effect that something exists; so [Something exists] exists. Plausibly, whenever there is a fact, f, f at least partially grounds the fact that f exists. So, [Something exists] grounds [[Something exists] exists]. But it's also plausible that existential generalizations are grounded in their witnesses, and [[Something exists] exists] witnesses [Something exists]. So, [[Something exists] exists] also grounds [Something exists]. So, [[Something exists] exists] both grounds and is grounded by [Something exists], in violation of antisymmetry. Assuming transitivity, we also get a violation of anti-reflexivity.

This puzzle has a number of variants and close cousins (see also Krämer 2013). But they all share one important feature: instead of attempting to "directly" counterexample the Hierarchy Thesis, they appeal to very general principles that most grounding theorists find independently attractive and which only jointly lead to a violation of anti-symmetry and anti-reflexivity. For this reason, adherents of the orthodoxy tend to take these puzzles much more seriously than intuitive counterexamples. The typical reaction to the latter has been to simply explain them away in irreflexivity and asymmetry-friendly ways (see, e.g., Raven 2013 for this kind of response). But there is no obvious way to use this strategy against the Fine-inspired puzzles, which caused some to go as far as (grudgingly) to abandon certain parts of the orthodoxy (Correia 2014, Woods 2018). Now, it wouldn't be fair to criticize any of the volume's individual contributions for not choosing the puzzles of grounding as their main topic. Still, there is something odd about the fact that the part of the volume that is dedicated to the Hierarchy Thesis contains no paper that seriously engages with the group of cases that actual proponents of the Hierarchy Thesis (and in particular the anti-reflexivity and anti-symmetry of grounding) are most concerned about.

Parts II-III take up the second half of the book. Einar Duenger Bohn argues ("Indefinitely Descending Ground) that there is no good reason for thinking that grounding is necessarily well founded and offers some arguments for thinking that it isn't even well-founded in the actual world.

Kelly Trogdon takes up a certain line of argument for the existence of a fundamental level, summed up in the slogan that non-fundamental things must "inherit" their reality from something. In this helpful and carefully written paper, Trogdon formulates this often-heard but elusive slogan as a valid argument for the conclusion that necessarily, every non-fundamental entity is grounded in some fundamental entities. He expresses skepticism about the general argument but defends a limited version of it in the form of a plausible principle about causal exclusion.

In "From Nature to Grounding", Jago defends a conception of grounding that ties it to essences, or as he calls them, natures. He thinks that grounding can be used to capture the relation between a thing's nature and its "formal constitution", i.e. the nature's constituents. This model is especially helpful, Jago argues, in understanding the grounding of logically complex states of affairs by their constituents, but suitably understood it can be generalized to properties and material objects as well. He finally argues that the resulting picture of grounding lends support to irreflexivity, asymmetry and transitivity, but not well-foundedness.

Wigglesworth, Tuomas E. Tahko and Matteo Morganti similarly aim to undermine or at least qualify well-foundedness in their respective essays. Wigglesworth does so by proposing a kind of mathematical structuralism in which a grounding-based notion of individuation plays a central role. His account leaves open that the identity of each natural number's identity is grounded by the identity of its successor (and not only its predecessor), which generates a series with a lower bound but no upper bound. This yields a notion of ground that is in an important sense not well-founded and, as Wigglesworth points out, also turns out to be reflexive.

Tahko undertakes to investigate the notion of fundamentality at issue in the "layered" picture of the world. He begins by pointing out that presently we lack strong evidence to believe of any particular set of entities that they are fundamental; for example, neither priority monism (the view that the fundamental entity is the cosmos) nor a strong version of priority pluralism (the idea that it's certain indivisible simples that are fundamental) is very well supported. Tahko thinks this motivates the search for an informative but less contentious characterization of the fundamental level, which he identifies in the notion of ontological minimality: the fundamental level consists of elements that are ontologically minimal, i.e. elements sufficient to give rise to "all the rest". He then proposes that this notion of fundamentality can even leave room for a kind of metaphysical infinitism, namely in the form of "boring" infinite descent (a kind of infinite descent in which the same elements get repeated over and over).

Morganti's essay provides an overview of possible ways in which the grounding structure of the world could lack a foundation. He contrasts coherentist and infinitist views, ultimately suggesting a kind of "hybrid" account on which the structure of reality is itself multifaceted, containing both coherentist and infinitist sub-structures.

The volume's last two essays map out some hitherto uncharted territory. In "On Shaky Ground? Exploring the Contingent Fundamentality Thesis", Nathan Wildman focuses on some underexplored questions about the relation between fundamentality and modality. His main focus is on two questions: whether fundamental entities exist necessarily and whether they have their fundamentality status necessarily (provided they exist). As he points out, each of the four possible combinations of answers are logically coherent, although not all of them are plausible. This exploratory paper should be helpful for much future research on the interaction between fundamentality and necessity.

The last paper, Filippo Casati's highly informative "Heidegger's Grund: (Para-) foundationalism", attempts to reconstruct Heidegger's views on grounding. He first distinguishes between ontic ground (which answers the question of why an entity is what it is) and ontological ground (which answers the question of why an entity is an entity at all). He then introduces Heidegger's doctrine of ontological difference (according to which being -- "Sein" -- is not itself a kind of being) and interprets Heidegger as adopting a kind of foundationalism about ontological ground: for any arbitrary entity, that entity's ontological ground is being. However, while Heidegger thinks that anything we can refer to is a being, he doesn't think that being itself is a being. This quickly leads to a paradox, since in describing being (even in this negative way), we appear to treat it as a being, after all. There is a lot of nuance in Casati's discussion, but he ultimately recommends that we interpret Heidegger as a "para-foundationalist", i.e. a dialetheist with the following (jointly inconsistent) views: being is both an entity and is not an entity, giving rise to two (also jointly inconsistent) grounding structures.

This volume covers a range of topics of current interest about grounding, dependence and fundamentality. Some of these already have a sizeable literature, while others are under-researched and (to my knowledge) make their first appearance in this collection. Philosophers working on stratified metaphysics could find this volume beneficial.


Calosi, Claudio (forthcoming), "Priority monism, grounding, and dependence," Philosophical Studies

Correia, Fabrice (2005), Existential Dependence and Cognate Notions, Munich: Philosophia

Correia, Fabrice (2014), "Logical grounds," Review of Symbolic Logic, 7: 31-59

Dasgupta, Shamik (2014), "On the plurality of grounds," Philosophers' Imprint, 14 (14), 1-28

Fine, Kit (2010), "Some puzzles of ground," Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 51, 97-118

Guigon, Ghislain (2015), "A universe of explanations," Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 9, 345-375

Jansson, Lina (2017), "Explanatory Asymmetries, Ground, and Ontological Dependence," Erkenntnis, 82: 17-44

Jenkins, Carrie (2011), "Is Metaphysical Dependence Irreflexive?," Monist, 94: 267-76

Koslicki, Kathrin (2015), "The Coarse-Grainedness of Grounding," Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 9: 306-44

Kovacs, David Mark (2018a), "The Deflationary Theory of Ontological Dependence," Philosophical Quarterly, 68: 481-502

Kovacs, David Mark (2018b), "What is wrong with self-grounding?," Erkenntnis, 83: 1157-1180

Krämer, Stephan (2013), "A simpler puzzle of ground," Thought, 2: 85-89

McKenzie, Kerry (forthcoming), "Structuralism in the Idiom of Determination," British Journal for the Philosophy of Science

Raven, Michael (2013), "Is ground a strict partial order?," American Philosophical Quarterly, 50: 191-199

Rydehn, Henrik (forthcoming), "Grounding and Ontological Dependence," Synthese

Schnieder, Benjamin (forthcoming), "Grounding and Dependence," Synthese

Simons, Peter (1987), Parts: A Study in Ontology, Oxford: Oxford University Press

Thomasson, Amie L. (1999), Fiction and Metaphysics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press

Woods, Jack (2018), "Emptying a Paradox of Ground," Journal of Philosophical Logic, 47: 631-48

[1] At this point it is fairly standard to distinguish between grounding and ontological dependence; see, for instance, Correia 2005: Ch. 1, Koslicki 2015, Tahko and Lowe 2016: §5, Jansson 2017: 34–9, Kovacs 2018a: 481–2, Calosi forthcoming §4.2, McKenzie forthcoming: §3, Rydehn forthcoming, and Schnieder forthcoming: §3, §5.1. It’s worth noting that there is more to the distinction than the platitude that grounding is a relation between facts whereas ontological dependence is category-neutral. Rather, there is reason to think that the two relations are directed in different ways. Grounding involves a kind of constraining of the grounded by the grounder: given that the grounder is in a certain way, the grounded has to be in a certain way. If the category of the relata were the only interesting difference between grounding and ontological dependence, we would expect the latter to have a similar profile: given that the dependent thing is in a certain way, the dependent would have to be in a certain way. Yet in the case of dependence, the direction of "constraining" runs exactly in the opposite direction: given that the dependent thing is in a certain way, it’s the dependee that has to be in a certain way. So there is good reason to think that it is at the very least a substantive metaphysical question whether there is any systematic connection between grounding and dependence; it is by no means obvious that they are simply converse relations (modulo categorical restrictions on their relata). See also Kovacs 2018a and Calosi forthcoming for a similar justification of the distinction.

[2] Simons (1987: 295), Thomasson (1999: 26) and Tahko and Lowe (2016: §4.2) are cases in point.