Reason and Conversion in Kierkegaard and the German Idealists

Reason And Conversion In Kierkegaard And The German Idealist

Ryan S. Kemp and Christopher Iacovetti, Reason and Conversion in Kierkegaard and the German Idealists, Routledge, 2020, 181pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780815396314.

Reviewed by Steven Hoeltzel, James Madison University


This carefully argued and erudite study is provocative in more than one way. In the book’s first half, Ryan S. Kemp and Christopher Iacovetti argue that the history of post-Kantian idealism “can be productively read as a sustained attempt to explain how radical value transformation occurs” —and thus as a sustained attempt to solve a problem posed by Kant’s inconclusive ruminations, in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, regarding the nature and possibility of radical moral conversion (2). The book’s second half then recounts Kierkegaard’s contribution to this debate—a debate which Kemp and Iacovetti take Kierkegaard to have effectively settled (139), and to have done so, moreover, in such a way as to have established that “the modern ethical project is, by its own standards, untenable” (95). From start to finish, the authors’ arguments are articulated with close attention to the central texts and advanced in critical dialogue with some of the finest recent scholarship. In addition to contributing to the historical account just outlined, each chapter offers a detailed, self-standing defense of more-specific interpretative claims that should be of independent interest to scholars of the period. In what follows, I offer a rough recounting of the book’s overarching historical narrative, calling attention, along the way, to some of the authors’ more noteworthy claims. I then conclude by pointing out some possible problems with the approach that Kemp and Iacovetti have taken to conceptually framing their material. First, though, a few words concerning the main problem around which the book is organized.

The type of ‘value transformation’ that is principally at issue here is the “radical conversion” of an individual, whereby that person’s “fundamental normative commitment . . . is replaced by another incompatible commitment” (10n8). As Kemp and Iacovetti note, the idea of such a conversion seems to raise a number of puzzles—especially if we suppose that such a profound change can be autonomously effected through a person’s authentic choice or rational endorsement of a fundamentally altered evaluative outlook. The chief worry here, I take it, is that given reasons internalism (which Kemp and Iacovetti appear to accept, and which in any case is key to the book’s overall argument (100)), and from the standpoint of the prospective radical convert (which, Kemp and Iacovetti argue, is the standpoint we should adopt in order to assess whether a conversion would be rational (59f.)), any considerations that could motivate or justify a truly radical value transformation must eo ipso be either volitionally unavailable (116) or epistemically opaque (62n49). This suggests (and Kemp and Iacovetti take Kierkegaard to argue) that radical conversion is best understood to be “always a function of external intervention” (3)—more specifically (in the paradigm Kierkegaardian cases) a result of the convert’s being subjected to a sort of “seduction” that works upon them principally by enriching their imagination, circumventing the intellect and the will (Chapter 6). Notably, this analysis is understood to apply not only to any unbeliever’s conversion to Christianity (Chapter 6.1) but also, and with equal force, to any immoral or amoral individual’s conversion to a life of ethical commitment (115n3; Chapter 6.3). Neither kind of conversion, on this account, can come about on the basis of the prospective convert’s preexisting volitional or rational resources—which seems to entail, among other things, that the modern ethical project must surrender its claims to rational universality and necessity (139, 167), and acknowledge its own dependence upon a kind of acceptance that is akin to religious commitment (Chapter 7.4).

On Kemp and Iacovetti’s account, those Kierkegaardian claims culminate a half-century of debate inaugurated by Kant’s 1793 Religion (23), in which the newly minted doctrine of the radical evil in human nature makes the possibility of radical conversion a matter of pressing concern. The authors offer a reading of the Religion according to which Kant explores, but ends up unwilling to endorse, each of three different models for understanding how radical conversion might take place: by spontaneous choice, “a nonrational decision to adopt a new foundational value” (3); by rational affirmation, “making explicit a central value that has hitherto been implicit” (3–4); or by grace, “having one’s foundational value transformed by an external source (God or otherwise)” (4). The spontaneous choice model seems to be ruled out by Kant’s requirements for action attribution (20). The rational affirmation model seems to be ruled out by the Religion’s account of the rational structure of agency (16, 21). And Kant’s remarks about grace, as Kemp and Iacovetti interpret them, effectively reduce to an admission that we simply cannot understand how radical moral self-transformation is possible, despite our conviction that it must indeed be so, given that the moral law unambiguously demands it (22).

Turning next to Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling’s 1795/96 Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism, Kemp and Iacovetti argue that this text has conversion as a central theme (25) and establishes the problem of radical conversion as a crucial post-Kantian concern (43). The Letters, on this reading, defend a spontaneous choice model according to which a person’s basic philosophical outlook always derives from their fundamental normative commitment, never the reverse (28). In consequence, any radical revision of one’s philosophical outlook—for example, a ‘conversion’ from dogmatism (Spinozism, more or less) to criticism (Fichtean idealism, as understood by Schelling at the time)—would have to supervene upon a philosophically unfounded choice to adopt a radically altered normative orientation (41). On one fairly standard reading of the Letters, Schelling comes to this conclusion because he thinks of dogmatism and criticism (which he takes to be mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive of the genuine philosophical options) as equally philosophically viable: for the purposes of pure theorizing and practical applicability, neither system outperforms its counterpart, and therefore any informed choice between them—and, perforce, any self-initiated conversion from one to the other—can have no properly philosophical justification and must instead reflect some prephilosophical practical disposition (Spinoza’s yearning for contemplative self-surrender, for example, or Fichte’s drive for ethical self-assertion). On Kemp and Iacovetti’s account, however, matters are rather more complicated: Schelling “remains a committed idealist in the Letters . . . [and] portrays criticism as both true and practically superior to its dogmatist rival” (25)—but he does so, by his own admission, based upon claims that the dogmatist is not rationally required to accept, and accordingly he “admits the impossibility of reasoning ‘consistent’ dogmatists into conversion” (39).

Johann Gottlieb Fichte is read as making essentially the same admission and, in consequence, endorsing a spontaneous choice model of philosophical conversion in his 1797/98 Attempt at a New Presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre, which Kemp and Iacovetti take up next. Here, too, the authors train their critical sights on some important recent scholarship. Their target in this case is the interpretation according to which, although Fichte does concede that dogmatism and idealism are radically opposed philosophical systems, and although he therefore maintains that each begs the question against its rival at every single step, he nonetheless holds that idealism can be shown to outperform dogmatism according to rational standards that apply to both systems because of the basic explanatory aims that they share. Against that latter claim, Kemp and Iacovetti argue at some length that although Fichte does offer several arguments for idealism’s overall superiority to dogmatism, he does not actually think that these arguments should be acceptable to a committed dogmatist (54–57). By Fichte’s own lights, they claim, “there is no all-things-considered reason for the dogmatist to choose idealism” (57). Hence, if any dogmatist ever were to convert to idealism, that could only be the result of a spontaneous, nonrational choice for self-reinvention in a new, libertarian spirit, abandoning their prior, fatalistic cast of mind.

As Kemp and Iacovetti interpret the post-Kantian tradition, it is not until Hegel takes the stage, in early work up to and including the Phenomenology of Spirit, that Kant’s most prominent heirs begin to think of a person’s fundamental philosophical commitments as susceptible to rational revision, not just ‘spontaneous’ rejection and replacement. But even with reference to Hegel’s position, Kemp and Iacovetti raise some doubts regarding how much work reason alone is actually expected to do. Naturally, they concede the plausibility of the received view of Hegel’s project, in the light of which we can see the dialectic as designed to elicit rivals’ conversion, by rational affirmation, to the standpoint of philosophical science. Nevertheless, they also argue that on Hegel’s own view, “readers [of the Phenomenology] must surrender their own positions in order to embark on the road to conversion in the first place” (80). If some such relinquishment is indeed required, and if a fairly strong form of reasons internalism is also affirmed (so that “sufficient reasons are measured by the positions that readers themselves hold, and by criteria that they themselves accept” (87)), then it becomes unclear whether and to what extent Hegel can be read as a rational affirmation theorist. One’s own foundational commitments seem not to be the sort of thing that a person could ever have sufficient reason to relinquish, insofar as they are “the commitment[s] by which she measures and evaluates the rationality of everything else” (87). Arguably, then, the success of Hegel’s project requires that potential converts to Hegel’s perspective make a nonrational, spontaneous choice to set aside their own most basic beliefs and values—commitments which, if unrelinquished, would constitute reasons for rejecting Hegel’s alternative concepts and criteria.

Of course, if we accept the above claims regarding the relationship between foundational commitments and sufficient reasons, then presumably the very idea of a spontaneous choice to relinquish or replace one’s own foundational commitments should strike us as outlandish, if not outright unintelligible. Prima facie, one could have no (internal) reason to make any such choice, and this seems to entail that no such (so-called) choice could qualify as a real instance of agency. And it also is far from clear, given reasons internalism, whether the idea of radical conversion by rational affirmation can be rendered any more comprehensible. It comes as no surprise, then, that Kemp and Iacovetti side with Kierkegaard’s claim that radical conversion can come about only by grace: conversion, on their view, is never “a direct intentional act,” but instead simply “something that happens to an agent” (126). More specifically, radical conversion can take place only on the basis of the sort of experience that “inculcates new desires” or opens up novel “normative possibilities” of which one was previously unaware (116). The result: “a qualitative shift in perspective that cannot simply be inferred from a person’s former assumptions” and that first enables a new ideal to become “imaginatively salient” (120), bringing a “new normative paradigm” into view (125).

In support of this account—and once again taking critical aim at more mainstream interpretations—Kemp and Iacovetti argue that Part I of Either/Or is designed to show that Judge William’s attempt to bring about A’s conversion by rational affirmation (that is, by demonstrating to A that A’s deepest commitments find their rational fulfillment only in an ethical, not an aesthetic, approach to life) is in principle doomed to fail. What would be required instead, were A’s conversion actually to be accomplished, is an act of “seduction” whereby A could be lured, via blandishments appealing to an aesthete, into an unlooked-for experience that points toward the possibility of embracing some hitherto-unappreciated higher ideal. Kemp and Iacovetti support and develop these claims, and the affiliated, grace-based account of radical conversion, with reference to a wide range of Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous writings and related recent scholarship. By way of concluding this review, however, I would like to bypass those interpretative issues and briefly focus instead on the basic conceptual contours of Kemp and Iacovetti’s account.

One unusual feature of that account is the capaciousness of the operative concept of conversion by grace: “having one’s foundational value transformed by an external source (God or otherwise)” (4). By that criterion, as Kemp and Iacovetti acknowledge, instances of conversion by grace can include radical value transformations that result from “brainwashing or other severe trauma” (49). To my mind, however, it seems odd to suppose that essentially the same process is undergone by both an aesthete, who (let us imagine) is ‘seduced’ by a much cannier version of Judge William into converting to a life of ethical commitment, and the Phineas Gage of medical folklore, who was ‘converted’ (supposedly) by a flying railway spike. Surely our hypothetical aesthete meaningfully participates in her own conversion, in a way that Gage clearly could not have participated in his? But Kemp and Iacovetti are at pains to deny exactly that—at least if by “meaningful participation,” we mean something like “active contribution.” The true hallmark of conversion by grace, on their account, is the outright “volitional passivity” of the convert (117, 133). Having rejected both spontaneous choice and rational affirmation, they seem to think themselves bound to endorse a model according to which neither reason nor agency can make any contribution (except in the form of ex post facto implementation) to a person’s radical self-transformation. The intellect and the will are just along for the ride. But why suppose that the viable models for understanding radical conversion are so few in number and so one-sided in content?

The answer, I suspect, is that Kemp and Iacovetti have allowed Kant’s 1793 account of the structure of agency to set the conceptual agenda for their book. Without a doubt, this yields a productive and provocative schema for organizing and interpreting the post-Kantian material. But I worry that it also results in an artificial and unhelpful narrowing-down of the philosophical options. Kant’s conception, in the Religion, of a single “supreme maxim” that radical conversion would replace is echoed by Kemp and Iacovetti’s assumption that each person has some single, supreme value which, in any case of self-initiated, radical self-transformation, that person would have to dislodge in one stroke. Given that assumption, ‘spontaneous choice’ and ‘rational affirmation’ look like obvious nonstarters: no spontaneous choice to overthrow one’s own highest value could have any actual basis in one’s aims as an agent, and any rational affirmation of some (supposedly) new highest value would in fact only reveal that this ‘new’ value, or perhaps some still higher one, had implicitly been one’s highest value all along. But then why start out from that assumption? Why not suppose instead, for example, that a person can have multiple ‘highest’ values, each of which can modulate the others, and all of which admit of elevation or demotion in the light of active rational reflection? Until it has been made clear why such alternatives should be discounted, it will, I think, be doubtful whether Kemp and Iacovetti have fully made their case. Be that as it may, however, there should be no doubt that this book makes a richly rewarding, impressively scholarly start.