Reason, Morality, and Beauty: Essays on the Philosophy of Immanuel Kant

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Bindu Puri and Heiko Sievers (eds.), Reason, Morality, and Beauty: Essays on the Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Oxford University Press, 2007, 191pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195683935.

Reviewed by Charles Goodman, Binghamton University


This volume, a commemoration of the 200th anniversary of Kant's death, is an ambitious attempt to explore the global significance of Kant's thought and investigate the historical influence and continuing relevance of his ideas in relation to both analytic and continental philosophical projects and both Western and non-Western philosophical traditions.  It contains contributions from authors representing many regions of the globe, including India, China, Germany, Turkey, Indonesia, and the United States.  Given the significance of the tasks which the volume undertakes, and the commendable broadness of its outlook, it is unfortunate that its level of quality is so uneven.  Although some of the essays are quite interesting, others have little to offer readers with even a basic familiarity with the literature on Kant.

The quality of editing on display in this book is not up to the usual high standards of Oxford University Press.  A number of the essays suffer from deficiencies in style and errors in grammar.  The chapter by Bindu Puri has particularly severe problems of this kind, including the unintentionally humorous misplacement of commas (p. 60), grammatical problems which lead to a lack of clarity (as at p. 63), and an incorrect reference to the title of a well-known work (p. 70).  Even those essays in the volume which are well-written could still benefit from a bit more proofreading.

By far the most impressive article in the volume is the contribution of Jonathan Dancy.  Dancy's other work can often be so technical and difficult as to be almost impenetrable, but this essay is commendably clear.  In it, he confronts one of the strongest objections against his particularist view of ethics, and does so in a careful, frank and stimulating way.  The objection starts from the observation that moral claims don't seem to be a posteriori, since they aren't confirmed in the same straightforwardly empirical way as scientific assertions or everyday reports about perceptible objects.  Since the division between a priori and a posteriori exhausts the domain of assertions, moral claims must be a priori.  This conclusion would make sense on a view where morality derives from one general principle such as Kant's Categorical Imperative.  But particularists such as Dancy deny that morality depends on principles in this way; they affirm that morality is a vast field of independent, specific truths that depend sensitively on the details of the contexts in which they apply.  So, as Dancy puts it, "the particularist is left in the uncomfortable position of holding that some contingent and particular truths can be known a priori" (p. 43).

Dancy's main response to the objection is to assert that certain judgments of similarity, such as the assertion that "Mozart's music is more like Haydn's than Beethoven's is like Bach's," are synthetic, a priori, particular, and contingent.  Thus, moral judgments are not the only ones that possess all four of these seemingly incompatible types of status (pp. 50-51).  The most difficult part of this case to make is that the judgments of similarity, while being known a priori, are also contingent.  For as Dancy points out, it seems that there are two different, closely related types of propositions involved in these judgments.  We might say that any music exactly like Haydn's, whoever happened to have written it, would be very similar to any music exactly like Mozart's; and this would be a necessary truth.  Or we might say that the music Haydn in fact happened to write was quite similar to the music Mozart in fact wrote, and this claim would clearly be contingent.  It seems that if one of these assertions is known a priori, it will be the first, not the second.

Dancy responds to this difficulty with another example:

I don't think this challenge is sound.  It is a necessary truth that Mark, given his actual height, is taller than Jonathan, given his actual height.  But the necessity of that truth is compatible with its being a stubbornly contingent truth that Mark is taller than Jonathan.  The necessary truth is a consequence of the contingent one, and, I would say, known only by knowing the contingent one.  (p. 51)

This example is an unfortunate one for Dancy's case, since there are principles that apply to heights: namely, the principles of arithmetic.  If Mark is six feet tall and Jonathan is five feet tall, then the relation between their heights is a consequence of the universal and necessary truth that anyone who is six feet tall is taller than anyone who is five feet tall.  In some cases, our knowledge of both the particular necessary truth and the particular contingent truth that Dancy cites in the quote could be dependent on our knowledge of this universal necessary truth.

The example of similarities between entire lifetimes of musical compositions is obviously vastly more complex.  But Kant, if we imagine him as Dancy's opponent, could certainly claim that we judge Mozart and Haydn to be similar by noting certain specific respects in which they are similar, and that we are therefore applying a complex body of universal a priori knowledge.  Dancy would reply that judgments about similarity are too inherently contextual to be reduced to any set of principles, no matter how complex.  But surely at least some of the claims we could make about the similarities between Mozart and Haydn are instances of true universal principles.  Perhaps whatever is objectively true about these similarities can be captured in such principles; whatever cannot be so captured may be traceable to the subjective tastes of each individual.  And if so, then Dancy cannot use the example of similarity to illuminate the moral case.  He will not have dispelled the sheer strangeness of imagining that a vast, messy, uncodifiable body of particular judgments could nevertheless be known a priori.

For these reasons, I am doubtful that Dancy's main argument succeeds.  Along with this important argument, however, he also presents a number of other highly interesting remarks.  For example, he deftly refutes the argument that since moral judgments must govern the behavior of all rational beings, they must therefore be universal in form.  He does this by pointing out that a conditional rule can apply over a large domain of quantification, even though only a small subset of the domain satisfies the antecedent of the conditional.  He also strikes at the heart of many recent reconstructions of Kant through his bold claim that "Kant was not trying to capture the idea of a moral reason" (p. 41).  Dancy's essay by itself is almost sufficient to justify the purchase of the entire book.

Reason, Morality, and Beauty contains several historical essays that do a good job of expounding the views of Kant and other thinkers, but make little original contribution.  This is true of the first chapter, by Sharad Deshpande, on the relation between Kant and the tradition of virtue ethics.  Deshpande does attempt a reconciliation between Kant and Aristotle, but recognizes that although the issues that concern them are often similar, they differ in their conceptions of the role of reason in the moral life.  The second chapter, by Goutam Biswas, is especially poorly written with little critical bite, juxtaposing Kant with various Continental figures, but without much of a philosophical payoff.  The essay by Xie Dikun is greatly superior in the quality of its writing style.  It expounds various neo-Kantian positions and discusses a large number of philosophers, but without doing much intellectual work with them or improving our understanding of Kant in any significant way.

Bindu Puri, one of the editors of the volume, contributes an article which seeks to criticize Kant's views about happiness and friendship from an Aristotelian perspective.  Although I sympathize with the general thrust of his remarks, I fear that the essay has significant defects both in organization and in argumentation.  On p. 59, Puri offers some expressions of disagreement with Kant's critique of pathological love that don't engage with the motivations behind that critique, as they are expounded by such recent interpreters as Allen Wood.  One particularly flawed argument appears on p. 56, where we read: "Also, if happiness has no role to play in making men good, it is difficult to say that friendship, which has certain complex but decisive influences on happiness, can be constitutive of that human good."  On p. 70, Puri makes a valuable point about the potential importance of moral correction that friends can offer us; but this point is intended as a criticism of Kant, and it is unclear whether Kant would have any reason to disagree with it.

Bijoy Boruah's essay, "Autonomy and the Virtue of Self-Legislation," is the best of the purely historical essays.  Boruah offers a thoughtful and well-written examination of the relation, in Kant's philosophy, between causality and freedom, and between sensual impulse and rational will.  The chapter sets out these extremely difficult issues in a clear and interesting way.

Several essays in the volume attempt to do comparative philosophy, bringing Kant into dialogue with non-Western traditions.  Goenawan Mohamad, in his essay on "The Difficulty of the Subject," discusses a wide variety of themes, including Kant's views on freedom and on the Enlightenment, Adorno's response to them, and the work of the Indonesian poet Chairil Anwar.  In the process, he makes an intriguing suggestion: "As I will argue in the later part of this essay, strangely the Muslim revivalist's challenge to the Enlightenment project, like the one proclaimed by Sayyed Qutb, ends up creating a problem just like the Kantian Enlightenment did" (p. 105).  But this bold promise is only partly kept, and these themes deserve a fuller development than they can receive in an essay that attempts so much.

Matthias Lutz-Bachmann's paper is entitled "'Religion and Public Reasoning': Enlightenment and Critical Deliberation on Religion in Western and Islamic Societies Today."  Lutz-Bachmann makes some suggestions about the proper role of religion in public life that are well worth discussing, and which are highly relevant to dialogue between Western and Islamic philosophers and to the dilemmas posed by Muslim minorities in secular European countries.  However, he says much less about Islam in particular than his title seems to promise.  Moreover, this article might have benefited from a discussion of the extensive reflections on the issue of public reason developed by Rawls and his followers.  But it is nevertheless a helpful contribution to an urgent issue of our times.

Hülya Yetisken presents some interesting remarks about the relation between certain of Kant's views about education and the actual system of education implemented by Ioanna Kuçuradi at the Hacettepe University.  Yetisken's essay succeeds in showing that the distinctive approach of this university can indeed be seen as a realization of certain Kantian ideas.  But she makes claims to uniqueness which are a bit too strong.  As Yetisken writes on p. 81, "So far as I know and I was able to inquire, Kuçuradi's view is the first, and perhaps the only one, which puts in connection philosophical knowledge related to ethical value problems with concrete examples of the same problems that we find in works of art."  However, the Confucian system of education in premodern China stressed the importance of poetic and historical texts in developing the character of students and providing them with examples for emulation.  The role of literary and historical examples in moral education is prominently on display, for instance, in the writings of Mencius.

The article by A. Raghuramaraju sets out to discuss the problem of the unknowability of the self in Kantian philosophy and to critique the approach to that problem offered by Krishnachandra Bhattacharyya.  Bhattacharyya had attempted to resolve Kant's difficulty by drawing on the tradition of Advaita Vedanta.  In view of the fact that the classical Indian philosophical tradition came to focus intensely on the questions of whether a self exists and how we can know about it, the topic Raghuramaraju chooses to discuss would seem to have a great deal of potential.  Unfortunately, this author ends up accomplishing little more than offering an example of how not to do comparative philosophy.

The problems that beset this article are considerably deeper than its defects of style.  They go beyond Raghuramaraju's references to "the somnolentness of modernity" (p. 141) and to Descartes' views about the "penal gland" (p. 135).  In particular, Raghuramaraju's explanation of Bhattacharyya's views is unclear, inelegant and poorly written.  At p. 143, moreover, he makes some sweeping claims about the role of the self in ancient thought.  Though his claims may be correct, the argument offered for them is very weak, as it depends on a nearly irrelevant quote from Aristotle and the bizarre assertion that, for Aristotle, "pair is prior to the individual."  Raghuramaraju also cites Aquinas' presentation of the cosmological argument, and puts great weight on an analogy between Aquinas' God, who is an unmoved mover, and Kant's self, which is an unknown knower.  But this analogy, as he articulates it, is both tenuous and forced.  Moreover, he entirely ignores Kant's critique of the cosmological argument.

On pages 146 and 147, Raghuramaraju quotes a large amount of material from primary and secondary sources about classical Indian philosophy.  Some of this material is interesting and could have been used to make a real contribution to the issue, while some is of quite dubious relevance.  But Raghuramaraju makes virtually no effort to discuss the implications of any of the quotations, or to develop any conclusions that might be of philosophical interest.  Comparative philosophy both can, and must, be done in a more professional and intellectually serious manner.

The volume concludes with two valuable chapters the starting points of which are Kant's aesthetics.  Martin Seel's essay does much to clarify and challenge some recent ideas in the philosophy of art, which he juxtaposes with Kant's views.  The essay tests these ideas in relation to several works of modern art which are quite clearly and vividly described.  Andrea Esser's chapter boldly argues for a much closer similarity than one would have expected between the aesthetic views of Kant and Marcel Duchamp.  She seeks to illuminate both the surprising relevance and the limitations of Kant's aesthetic theory as applied to the world of modern art.

The future of humanity may depend on the ability of people from all the world's great civilizations to communicate with and learn from each other.  The acknowledged continuing significance and universal relevance of the philosophy of Kant makes it an entirely suitable topic for this kind of dialogue.  The idea behind this book is therefore a sound one.  I only hope that the global conversation of philosophy will be carried on in the future at a more consistently high level than is on display in this book.