Reason of State, Propaganda, and the Thirty Years' War: An Unknown Translation by Thomas Hobbes

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Noel Malcolm, Reason of State, Propaganda, and the Thirty Years' War: An Unknown Translation by Thomas Hobbes, Oxford University Press, 2007, 227pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199215935.

Reviewed by A. P. Martinich, University of Texas at Austin


Noel Malcolm's book consists of six stage-setting chapters, Hobbes's English translation of a manuscript version of a pamphlet written in Latin during the Thirty Years' War, and the Latin text of the published version. Malcolm's chapters are a tour de force of scholarship. Malcolm discusses Hobbes's early life, minutiae of the War, Hobbes's style of handwriting, and what the watermarks on the manuscript of the translation indicate, among other things. The philosophical content, contained in a discussion of "reason of state," is light.

Hobbes translated the short work, Altera secretissima instructio Gallo-Britanno-Batava Friderico V data, ex belgica in latinam linguam versa, et optimo publico evulgata, published on the Continent in 1626, probably at the request of William Cavendish, the first Duke of Newcastle, who played a significant role both in Hobbes's intellectual life and in English politics. The anonymous work was purportedly written by an advisor to Frederick V, the Elector Palatine and son-in-law of King James I when Frederick accepted the kingship of Bavaria in 1619. The author recommends that Frederick overthrow James's successor, his son Charles I, who ascended the throne in 1625: "attempt England. in that kingdome all is swolne. you will driue out ye young King at first dash, as one that is hated by nobility" (180, verbatim). In fact, the author was no doubt opposed to Frederick and was trying to demoralize him by pointing out the strength and wealth of the anti-Palatine forces, and the weakness and the unreliability of his supposed allies (48, 190), such as England, France, the Netherlands, Denmark, and Venice. Near the end of the pamphlet the author in effect summarizes Frederick's situation,

The body of your enemies … is too strong and too great… . The strong chains in which it binds us cannot be broken or moved by our own strength … War is long, life is short, the expense is certain, the outcome is doubtful, your enemy is persistent, your allies are inconstant, those hostile to you are unanimous, your confederates are quarrelsome, your exile is at hand, hope is far-off (190, 196).

Neither the pamphlet itself nor Hobbes's translation, A second most secret instruction Gallo-britanno-batauian, giuen to Fredericke the V [verbatim], was or could have been published in England since it advocated sedition against the King, Charles I, and described Charles's government as impoverished and overcommitted internationally (134-38). Possibly fewer than ten printed copies were surreptitiously brought into England (62), and Hobbes's translation, somewhat incomplete, came from a manuscript, the text of which is not identical to the printed text. Hobbes's translation, which is not mentioned in any surviving document, fell still-born from Hobbes's hand. This is not to say that the pamphlet was incompetently written. To the contrary, it contains information about the intrigues of the Thirty Years' War that indicates some insider knowledge, and no one responded to it in print probably because its case was fairly cogent: Frederick was in dire straits, and only two options remained, "Prayers, and Fraud" (172).

The pamphlet belongs to the 'reason of state' [ragion di stato] genre, which explains the actions of nations on the basis of what is in their self-interest. The mode of strategizing is Machiavellian -- "Successe makes any defence iust" (182); the narrative of events Tacitean (92). Every significant act was judged either honestum [virtuous] or utile [useful or profitable], with the useful being identified with the reasonable. Acting in accord with a reason of state was to act in one's own interest. It was both descriptive of how nations did act and how they ought to act. As Malcolm says, "Much of the art of ruling consists of making deceptions of various kinds: these, the 'arcana imperii', were easily identified with the stratagems of the Machiavellian prince" (96). Part of the author's advice to Frederick is "to use not only forces and stratagems, but also nothing less than criminal acts and things contrary to divine law" (188, 190).

A crucial component of reason of state strategy was the use of religion as "an instrument of rule." There are basically two interpretations of this view. One is that all Machiavellians thought that religion was bunk; the other is that some of them thought that the one true religion, Christianity, or the right kind of Christianity, was the best instrument of rule (96-9). Hobbes suggests the latter view in Leviathan chapter 14, paragraph 22, although most scholars attribute the former view to him.

The content of the pamphlet is somewhat puzzling. It is to some extent "satirical or parodic" in that it takes reason-of-state tactics to an extreme, but it also gives advice that sounds more moderate and principled. About alliances with infidels, the author warns that "such vngodly aydes, will proue the ruine of them that seeke them" (107, verbatim); and it also expresses the sober view that underlies reason-of-state policy: "in the decisions made by princes interest will always override every other argument" (107). As Malcolm says, "The author … simultaneously seeks to build on its credibility and exploit its disreputability" (107-8).

Hobbes of course knew about reason-of-state strategy since the library at Hardwick Hall contained many such works (109), as well as a number of books by and about Tacitus (110). As for his view of the content of the pamphlet, Hobbes was commissioned to do the translation and may or may not have agreed with its polemic. Malcolm's sensible but highly speculative reasoning about the small circumstantial evidence that exists leans in the direction of thinking that Hobbes was sympathetic with it (82-91, 112).

How valuable is Malcolm's book for scholars of Hobbesiana? Little. It is a bit more important than the knowledge that Hobbes received an M.A. at Cambridge, and that he probably played a part in Ben Jonson's The King's Entertainment at Welbeck Abbey, where Charles I stopped during his coronation trip to Scotland. Neither fact is mentioned by Malcolm in his detailed description of Hobbes's education and life up to about 1630. As relating to Hobbes's intellectual development, Malcolm emphasizes that Hobbes was a highly skilled translator during the 1610s and 20s. He translated a series of letters, written in Italian by Fulgentio Micanzio, secretary to Paulo Sarpi, to his employer the earl of Devonshire, translated some of the essays of Francis Bacon, and, of course, translated Thucydides' History of the Peloponnesian War (1628). To these translations, we can now add the Altera secretissima instruction.

What philosophical value does this pamphlet have? Virtually none. What light does it throw on Hobbes's philosophical development? Very little. Near the end of his last chapter, Malcolm draws some parallels between "a number of themes and lines of argument" in Hobbes's works after 1639 "that seem to echo the teachings of 'ragion di stato' theory" (114). These parallels are of some interest to intellectual historians. Malcolm concludes, "In various ways, then, it seems reasonable to align Hobbes's political theory with that of ragion di stato" (118). However, Hobbes did not teach prudence about governing but developed a science of politics (119). Also, he thought that the best foundation for stable government was the people's "understanding of the nature and justification of authority." Following Jeremy Waldron, Malcolm calls this a version of John Rawls's 'principle of publicity' (122).

Although only the most historically oriented historians of philosophy will find this book interesting, Malcolm's careful, erudite edition of the translation and his discussion of the minutia of the Thirty Years' War must be lauded. To fully understand his scholarship, one would have to know Latin, German, Dutch, French, Italian, and Serbo-Croatian, and then devote about a decade to reading his sources.