Reason, Revelation, and Devotion: Inference and Argument in Religion

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William J. Wainwright, Reason, Revelation, and Devotion: Inference and Argument in Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 203pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107650367.

Reviewed by Matthew Frise, Baylor University


This book focuses on fringes. It aims to legitimize a central role in religious reasoning for things philosophers have either overlooked or looked down on: religious texts, the passions, rhetoric, revelation, and God's mysterious nature. Its breadth is admirable. It discusses in detail thinkers from eastern and western religious and philosophical traditions, from antiquity to present. Its topics are interesting and underexplored in philosophy, and Wainwright navigates them with minimal jargon and technicality. The book is part of an interdisciplinary text series for undergraduates studying religion and philosophy, and it will serve its target audience well. However, its underdevelopment on some fronts will limit its appeal to philosophers at the graduate level or beyond. I will remark further on this after summarizing each chapter.

Chapter 1 offers four instances of religious reasoning, so that the reader will have concrete examples to refer back to. It states and evaluates Samuel Clarke's cosmological argument for God's existence, Wainwright's own reasoning on omnipotence, historical Hindu and Buddhist reasoning on whether the "ultimate reality" is a person, and Pelagius and Augustine's dispute about freedom and grace.

Chapter 2 explores a variety of uses to which one can put a religious argument. The uses include solving disputes, encouraging others, and aiding devotional practices. One might extend this list indefinitely -- I can use a religious argument to distract you while my partner filches your wallet, and to do much more -- but Wainwright likely has a certain class of uses in mind, namely, those that tend to assist the religious life. His main focus is the use in "the search for truth" and in "discussions with nonbelievers" (40). In these cases, the goodness of an argument, he suggests, is person-relative. By "goodness" Wainwright means something like "efficacy," not "merit". A religious argument might in fact persuade me but not you. It is good relative to me but not you.

Wainwright thinks many factors contribute to this, such as a person's background, purposes, and interests. He thinks other factors contribute to whether one will assess an argument as adequate, such as one's evaluations of worldviews, prior probabilities, and support relations. Wainwright here is descriptive and not evaluative. He is listing what affects our assessments, not what ought to (for Wainwright, what ought to be effective is invariant across persons). He might then have considered other factors -- such as whether one has recently slept well or had coffee or found a dime -- and might have consulted empirical research. But Wainwright's purpose here is to help set the stage for the next two chapters, which cover other factors on which the efficacy of an argument, for a person, hinges.

Chapter 3 makes a case for the importance of religious texts. Wainwright claims that immersion in a religion's texts is crucial for a full understanding of its value-laden claims and supporting arguments. And one is more likely to believe a religious text one understands fully. What's more, Wainwright claims, the justification for accepting a religious tradition typically involves an appeal to that very tradition. Such a self-supporting maneuver looks suspiciously circular, and Wainwright's next chapter aims to eliminate suspicion. It also looks problematically insular, and Wainwright thinks one overcomes this by practicing comparative theology.

Chapter 4 focuses on religion and "passional" reasoning. Wainwright's view here is that evidence for religious belief can be accurately assessed only by people with the "proper passions". Sometimes he equates these with moral and spiritual qualifications (60), other times with emotions and desires (149). The bulk of the chapter explicates views similar to Wainwright's, namely, those of Jonathan Edwards, John Henry Newman, William James, and Wang Yangming. Wainwright notes that this family of views seemingly introduces "rampant subjectivism," since the passions seem causally disconnected from the truth. One should root out the beliefs that one learns are caused by passion. In response to this worry, Wainwright says the advocates of the family of views think that the passions are in fact connected with the truth, that they are "reflections of reality, causal or quasi-causal products of the states of affairs represented by the beliefs they generate" (78). James credits evolution for this, and Edwards and Wang credit other causes. The reader is not offered reason to agree with James and company. Wainwright also addresses a circularity worry for the family of views. He claims that the only circularity involved turns out to be not only benign but also common to reasoning in philosophy and in other disciplines.

Chapter 5 aims to support the use of rhetoric in philosophical reasoning. Wainwright claims that argument alone isn't enough to persuade. One must also use rhetorical devices in order to legitimize one's methodology to one's audience. Indeed, rhetoric is essential to philosophy. Philosophy is saturated with metaphor, more so than science is. And "metaphor has traditionally been part of the theory of rhetoric" (95). So, Wainwright argues, if metaphor is essential to philosophy, rhetoric is too. One might worry that any connection between philosophy and rhetoric is merely contingent, a cultural accident. In reply, Wainwright states he is reasonably confident that a complete comparative philosophical and theological investigation will show otherwise. The reader might rightly worry, however, that such an investigation will at best reveal a contingent correlation.

Chapter 6 surveys perspectives on revelation, and on its relation to reason. Wainwright compares traditional Hindu and Christian views, explains Locke's view, and criticizes a standard deistic view. Wainwright also argues that Cambridge Platonists and sixteenth- and seventeenth-century Puritans agree more than it might seem; both think revelation transcends rather than conflicts with reason.

Chapter 7 examines whether and how God is mysterious. We should believe God is mysterious because his perfections render him greater than can be thought. His perfect joy and knowledge, for example, have incomprehensible structures. For Wainwright the specific object of mystery is God's essence. Its mysteriousness is said to be irreducible and intrinsic, irremovable by any learning. It is not simply because of our limited intellects that God's essence is mysterious. This mysteriousness does not preclude our having knowledge about him, but does limit our understanding. Because mystery is intrinsic to God's essence, it is in a sense incomprehensible even to God.

This book has many virtues. Philosophers in or past graduate school will wish it had a few others. Its coverage is imperfect. Chapter 1 can be skipped without loss. That chapter supplies four examples of religious reasoning, but all are on topics unrelated to the book. Each of the other chapters, and everyday life, provides many examples of religious reasoning, so the reader will find it unnecessary to thumb back to a chapter just for illustrations. This explains why the rest of the book does not discuss the particulars of Chapter 1 in any detail. The reader would have benefited more from a later chapter that carefully brought together the rest of the book. The introduction gives only a far-off picture of how the book's main theses come together. Each chapter plucks an ingredient from the pantry only to deposit it on the counter, not in the mixing bowl.

Several chapters share the book's fate in this regard. Some never state a thesis. Many sections in chapters never explain how they connect with preceding material. To piece things together, I often had to look back at the book's brief introduction and skip ahead to its briefer conclusion. Only in the conclusion of the book, for example, are we told that Chapter 6 "concluded that while revelation may transcend reason, it need not be opposed to it" (150). Chapter 6 itself tells us only that the Puritans and Platonists agreed on this conclusion. We aren't told that, nor why, we should agree.

Similarly, Chapter 4 states Wainwright's view about the role of the passions in assessing evidence, and then it explicates similar views held by historical thinkers. Yet the conclusion of the book reports: "Chapter 4 offered a variety of reasons in support of the claim that right emotions and right desires are necessary conditions of discerning truth about value-laden matters and defended that claim against charges of subjectivism and circularity" (149). Only the historical thinkers offer a variety of reasons, and only for views similar to Wainwright's. The variety relies on many undefended and questionable assumptions. So the reader of Chapter 4 will doubt that it even attempts to support Wainwright's view. And some of the thinkers favored views that seem to differ importantly from Wainwright's. For example William James, according to Wainwright, believes that when an issue could not be "'decided on intellectual grounds' . . . 'subjective factors' were needed to decide the issue conclusively" (70). So James thinks that in certain circumstances, one can conclusively decide only via the passions. But this isn't to say that the passions are required in all circumstances involving value-laden matters, or are required for reaching a suitable but less than conclusive decision.

Other chapters do not quite chase their stated quarry. Chapter 7 for instance says "The burden of this chapter is that" reflections on God are distorted if they do not give a central place to his being mysterious (134). We then learn about the nature of God's mysteriousness, but not about how our failing to respect this mystery risks distorting our reflections. For all that is shown, it may be that we just risk having incomplete, not inaccurate, views. Or, since God's mysteriousness allegedly cannot be rubbed out by anything we learn, maybe all reflections on him risk distortion, even those that acknowledge mystery.

Finally, I wanted more from Wainwright's overall helpful exegesis. Chapter 1 commendably attempts to formulate Clarke's cosmological argument with precision. But the chapter contains no quotes from Clarke, nor even a reference to any work of his. The exposition of other historical thinkers almost falls off the horse on the other side. The main method is often explication by quotation. Passages are produced but often not restated plainly for novices. Key terms often aren't partnered with definitions.

In short, this book has the most to offer to undergraduates who want an introduction to a nice range of topics and figures in religion and philosophy. The book offers less to graduate students and other advanced philosophers. Still, there is much to learn from it, and Wainwright is to be praised for drawing attention to worthwhile frontiers in the philosophy of religion.