Reason's Grief: An Essay on Tragedy and Value

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George W. Harris, Reason's Grief: An Essay on Tragedy and Value, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 300pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521863287.
Swarthmore College

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Here are two ways of thinking about the main topics and tasks of moral philosophy. 1) Above all else, moral philosophy is concerned with action, specifically with which actions are obligatory, permissible, and impermissible in particular situations. Figuring out the right or best or dutiful thing to do is what moral philosophy is all about. There are important choices to be made in both public and personal policy, and moral philosophy had better help us with these. We might look to any of utilitarianism, rational choice theory, or certain forms of Kantianism in order to address such questions about action, but one way or another some theory must be in view. 2) Human life is complicated, and there are no formulae or policies that will help us clearly and decisively to choose in specific settings to act in the one way that is right or obligatory or best. Moral philosophy should be devoted more to the understanding of the complexities of the human form of life and to the sorts of characters and skills people might well develop, where no characters or sets of skills will count as unambiguously best or right. Literary and historical narratives of particular cases may offer as much or more moral insight than do theories of the right and the good. The work of Bernard Williams and, more recently, Raymond Geuss points in this direction, along with certain strands of virtue ethics.

Reason's Grief is a comprehensive and ambitious book that argues for the latter stance against the former and that does so with a distinctively tragic and naturalist-Darwinian twist. Harris undertakes "to bring thinking about tragedy and the tragic aspects of life to the center of our ethical thought" (2). (Already one can hear the second stance in the phrase "ethical thought" as against, say, "moral theory.") The tragic dimension is that things, for everyone, "are likely to turn out very badly, the more so the more noble you are" (2); "high value is pervasively and perpetually vulnerable to destructive forces" (3), including at least death, illness, war, conflict of all kinds, boredom, cruelty, the indifference of nature, and so on. Homer saw all this. Aristotle challenged him in supposing that good luck, clear understanding, and cooperative phronesis can lead normally to a good life (5-6). Moral philosophy has mostly followed Aristotle rather than Homer, but with less and less confidence as images of the good develop from Leibniz and Locke on happiness, to Kant on autonomy, to Hegel on reconciliation, to Schopenhauer on resignation, to Nietzsche on ecstatic-voluntarist affirmation. Now, according to Harris, it is time to pull the plug on this tradition and to recognize that nothing unambiguously good is achievable. "Religion is, even at its best, a deception;" "what must be accepted is a form of hopelessness" (21), though we might find a "new hopefulness" -- more modest and secularized -- in "a form of godlessness, freely chosen and uncoerced" (22): no more fairly tales about providence and superintending intelligences.

Without such fairy tales, we must face the fact that values -- constituted by human caring and by nothing else -- are inherently plural, incommensurable, incomparable, and non-absolute (29). In Chapter 8, "Best Life Pluralism and Reason's Regret," the strongest and most interesting chapter of the book, Harris develops this view by arguing against Martha Nussbaum's best life pluralism. Following Aristotle, Nussbaum holds that the best life is the one that involves the best "integrated whole of a plurality of goods" (200), where this whole is inclusive (it lacks nothing that could coherently be added to it), transparent (undistortive of any object or character of care), and final (valued for its own sake) (201-2). "The best life is one that integrates as a whole the most inclusive set of goals in a way that does not distort their true value and that expresses some pattern of meaning and unity" (204). Nussbaum departs from Aristotle, however, in weakening the inclusiveness condition, thus arriving at what Harris calls "best life pluralism". It is, for her, not true that there is only one way of life that is most integrated, and so best, for the entire human species. There are more goods to be more integrated in more ways within more multiple patterns than those of civic friendship and intellectual contemplation. Hence Nussbaum is open to the thought that taking up one integrated way of life may involve regret for genuine goods foregone. Nor, for her, is it true that happiness will necessarily result from pursuing some integrated whole of a plurality of goods. Yet she retains some optimism that reflective reasoning can guide us toward choosing better integrated, hence better, lives rather than worse ones.

Harris is tougher than this. His pluralism is "tragic pluralism," according to which "occasions for sorrow … are pervasive and perpetual" (229). Reason's grief -- stronger and deeper than reason's regret -- is the recognition that this is so. Values are, sometimes, not only incommensurable, but also incomparable. Incommensurable values can sometimes be compared by setting against one another notable vs. nominal cases of their instancing, as Ruth Chang has argued. But this procedure of comparing notables vs. nominals will not help for intermediate cases. "Within [a] zone [of uncertainty and the stultification of choice] the options are incomparable. So best life pluralism is false" and, hence, "the consolation of reason's regret is inaccessible" (242). Liberty vs. security and equality vs. cultural excellence are, according to Harris, clear examples of such incomparable values. Within a zone of uncertainty, we will simply have to make tough choices, without guidance from principle or theory, about which way to go, and no matter how we choose we will have to grieve that some genuine good will be lost. We cannot even console ourselves that we have done the best that we could, for in light of incomparability there is no clear best that could be done.

Harris's argument that certain basic values are sometimes incomparable is further buttressed by his Darwinism. Anyone's finding anything good must, ultimately, be "the expression of a balance of chemicals" (194). Only this view, or something like it, "satisfies the naturalistic constraint on understanding the human condition" (194). (This view is, at best, speculative, and, at worst, groundlessly reductionist, in stipulatively ruling out subtler naturalist positions such as anomalous monism.) One might hope that a "pure equilibrium" of chemicals in balance is possible: a condition of loving coherently only what is good, which condition could be disturbed only by external disruption. But on Darwinian grounds this hope is nonsense. We are just not built to be maximally coherent in our value commitments, nor is the universe built to support our coherent valuing. Instead, any way of caring is impure, in involving tradeoffs and imperfect balances.

With this general theory of valuing in place, Harris makes short work in Chapters 3 to 7 of alternative value stances. Romanticism, which Harris reads somewhat simplistically as involving a "glorification of the will" and a commitment to acting on sentiment (66), collapses into either fantastic reverie or nihilism (if it is at all realistic about the unlovability of the world). A Kantian kingdom of ends is not a projectible world (99). "Practical reason does not proceed from the impersonal point of view and … it does not project indefinitely into the future" (102). Epicureanism is "a form of decadence, a flight from the will to live for the things we value most" (123). Benthamite utilitarianism and decision theory both founder on the incomparability of values.

Yet we need not, quite, be Schopenhauerian pessimists. It is possible, in a Romantic realist spirit, simultaneously to pursue personal goods and to "live with the awareness of suffering" (107), possible "not [to] allow the suffering of others to eclipse [one's] view of what makes life worth living" (108). Above all, "the first step in avoiding despair is divesting ourselves of utopian fantasies in which it is clear that all that is bad is necessitated by the greater good" (251). We should grow up and follow Homer rather than the Platonic-Aristotelian-Christian-Kantian tradition.

Harris presents a sustained argument in favor of his Homeric-Darwinian-realist stance that is well worth considering. Moral philosophy is perhaps too often complacent in focusing on solving problems of action when it should instead be cultivating broader ethical thought. Yet it is unclear that Harris's own picture of grownup, fully secularized, tragic ethical thought is as well worked-out as it might be.

First, Harris's talk of tradeoffs and balances among goods pursued, but without principles (either utilitarian-economic or rights- and justice- oriented), leaves him defending a subjectively voluntaristic Realpolitik stance in both public and personal policy. One should -- while grieving for what will be lost -- just do what one really cares about and make hard choices in doing so. Harris specifically illustrates this stance politically by talking about the necessity of simply settling, without principles of either usefulness or justice, on some balance of anti-terrorism measures vs. concern for liberty. But if no principles and no long-term vision of where we might go together as a society are in view, then there are at least substantial risks of arbitrariness, brutality, and lack of general persuasiveness attaching to any particular policy choice. Force will rule. It seems at least possible that we might do better to chasten the rule of force with some form of appeal to principle for the long term. (Without principles in view, what is there to be said about Abu Ghraib? Just that some of us do not care for it?) Similar considerations apply to the need for reflection to inform the construction of a longer-term life plan and a sense of self-identity at the personal level.

Second, it is not clear that Harris has read Kant as generously as he might be read; in particular, it is not clear that he understands the valuable work that consideration of the Kantian ideal of a kingdom of ends might do for us. No one is more aware than Kant of the tragic character of human life as it has actually existed. History is, empirically speaking, a slaughterbench, and human beings in general have a natural tendency toward evil. Yet Kant retains the idea that a kingdom of ends is possible in principle deo volente. We are to do the best we can to form a human community of perpetual peace, mutual respect, and even mutual support. There is no guarantee that we will be able to do this; in fact, all the empirical evidence is against it. But it is not, one might say, necessarily impossible, and so the ideal of a kingdom of ends remains relevant as an ideal, as we scrutinize now how we are doing. By comparison of our present situation -- of any present situation -- with this ideal, one may get some sense of orientation in both personal and public policy, as we, to use a phrase of Stanley Cavell's "think for tomorrow." Against this suggestion, Harris poses his Darwinism and his sense of the existence of significant, actual, irresolvable problems. But it is not clear that Darwinism and hard cases make this kind of Kantian moral thinking either impossible or irrelevant.

Third, a major strand of contemporary moral and political philosophy accepts Kant's sense of both the empirically tragic character of human life and the relevance of ideals. Rawls' theory of justice takes as its point of departure the thought that human beings just do not agree with one another on comprehensive substantive goods; perhaps they do not even 'agree with themselves' about such goods, and perhaps even they could not. The question that Rawls then raises is: what would the conditions of fair cooperation in the maintenance of a joint social life be, for a community of human beings who disagree with one another substantively? What are the principles and institutions of fairness, given that there is substantive disagreement about the good? Again, it does not seem either impossible or unproductive to ask such questions and to venture answers. We may get more and better provisional, long-term orientation from doing so than we do from Harris's neo-Darwinist Realpolitik. Similar things might be said in defense of Nussbaum's neo-Aristotelian capabilities approach to questions of social policy. In both cases, reflection about values is immanent within and responsive to a sense of ongoing conflicts, personal and public alike. These stances are arguably more grownup than Harris's. In the end, perhaps we need and can have ideal theories of justice, obligation, and right as well as flexible ethical thought.