Reasonable Disagreement: A Theory of Political Morality

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Christopher McMahon, Reasonable Disagreement: A Theory of Political Morality, Cambridge UP, 2009, 204pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521762885.

Reviewed by David B. Wong, Duke University



This book aims to explain reasonable disagreement over questions of political morality. Disagreement is reasonable when competent engagement with the relevant considerations is compatible with reaching different conclusions (19). Examples of reasonable disagreement discussed include the issues of whether fairness requires the public provision of assisted living for the elderly, whether justice requires that the highly talented be paid a lot more for contributing in the socially most useful way or that they not receive special benefits because they cannot claim credit for the talents they possess, and whether a democratic socialist or a democratic capitalist arrangement is the proper form of political cooperation. In such cases, the task is to explain both the reasonableness — that both sides can be competent reasoners - and the disagreement - that each persists in viewing the other as mistaken. McMahon argues that the theory fulfilling this explanatory task is “moral ”SpellE">nominalism," a kind of constructivist theory occupying an intermediate position between realist and non-cognitivist theories of political morality.1

Moral nominalism is cognitivist in holding that moral judgment expresses belief, but is not realist in holding that moral truths are the products of perspectives rather than existing independently of any actual or hypothetical perspective. McMahon argues that realist theories have difficulty explaining reasonable disagreement. For example, non-naturalist moral realists might assert that humans do not have full epistemic access to the moral truth, with the result that equally competent reasoners on a given issue could come to different conclusions. McMahon counters that parties to reasonable disagreements about political morality are often adamant about the correctness of their views, whereas epistemic competence leads to a retreat from certainty when epistemic access is doubtful (30). One could imagine realist replies to this criticism, e.g., that one party to such disagreements may not recognize that the other side is as competent as it is (in matters of political morality, after all, each side often has a stake in failing to come to such a recognition; furthermore, lack of full epistemic access could result in each side’s failing to recognize adequately the force of the other side’s case). McMahon does not pursue an extended critique of such competing possible explanations from moral realism.

Against naturalistic forms of realism that identify moral properties with natural properties, McMahon argues that do not account for the normativity of moral judgment. Advocates of this form of realism typically employ a Humean theory according to which the normativity of a practical reason to perform an action rests on the action’s conduciveness to satisfying a desire of the agent. However, McMahon holds that a distinction must be made between desires whose objects the agent has genuine reason to pursue and desires the agent merely happens to experience (32). He lodges the same complaint against noncognitivist theories that construe moral judgments as expressing or otherwise grounded in desires the agent happens to have. McMahon does not address the various ways in which moral realists or noncognitivists might try to explain how desires are subject to critical scrutiny in ways compatible with a Humeanism of practical reasons, e.g., through higher-order desires that one’s life take a certain shape.

This book is best read as developing a positive alternative to the more-established and familiar theories, rather than as engaging in a developed critique of these theories. The considerable value of this book lies in the ways moral nominalism is developed and applied to the explanation of reasonable disagreement. McMahon does this with subtlety and care, often with admirable perceptiveness about the ways in which normative reasoning and extra-normative forces on the personal and social levels interact and mutually influence one another. The book is not an easy read. Moral nominalism is presented on a high level of abstraction that makes demands on the reader, and even the examples of reasonable disagreement, though helpful, are also stated at a high level of abstraction. Nevertheless, those who take seriously the possibility of reasonable disagreement will appreciate the theoretical resources that McMahon has developed for understanding it. Those who deny reasonable disagreement because they fear that its recognition will slide into a radical subjectivism or relativism will need to deal with McMahon’s argument that it does not.

McMahon calls his view nominalist partly because it views moral judgment as involving (in roughly a Goodmanian spirit) the making and remaking of moral worlds. These worlds arise from human attempts to construct normative structures for social cooperation. The view is also nominalistic because it takes the possession of a moral concept to lie in mastery of the corresponding moral term, which in turn is explained without invoking moral properties. McMahon presents a Wittgensteinian picture of the structure of moral concepts, in which a learner is first presented with examples of a term’s correct application and then masters its usage by going on to apply it to new cases through picking out relevant similarities with the exemplar cases. In doing so, the learner demonstrates proper functioning of her linguistic and motivational capacities, including dispositions to pick out the relevant similarities. These dispositions, in fact, constitute the relevant similarities; the similarities do not exist independently of them.

Because they are practical, evaluative concepts involve “target-setting.” For example, in identifying something as good, we label it as worthy of some kind of response, such as choice. Worthiness of response can be spelled out in terms of reasons to respond. In accordance with his criticism of a Humean conception of desire-based reasons, McMahon does not identify reasons with the desires an agent happens to experience but rather with the features of actions and circumstances that merit a response. Learning from examples of the correct application of an evaluative concept is learning not only the descriptive features that merit response but also learning to experience the correct response. Learning “to go on” in applying an evaluative concept is learning to take descriptive features of new cases as relevantly similar to the features in the examples of correct application and also learning to experience motivations that register in these new cases as relevantly similar to the motivations experienced in the examples. A child who learns from examples how to apply the concept of beauty will not only extrapolate to relevantly similar descriptive features but also experience relevantly similar motivations in the new cases, such as choosing an object with those features or contemplating it. The descriptive and motivational aspects of relevant similarity will mutually influence one another. When I take an object to possess the relevant descriptive features, I will tend to experience the motivations merited by beauty, and when I experience those motivations, I will tend to take certain descriptive features of the object as relevantly similar to the features I learned from examples. This picture of the developing mastery of evaluative concepts, therefore, involves the interweaving of cognitive and conative elements. It is an interesting and plausible implication yielding a robust practicality for evaluative concepts without sacrificing the cognitive element that allows deliberative moral discourse and logical inference among normative judgments.

The relevant motivational disposition in the case of judgments of political morality is a disposition to contribute to a cooperative venture with an outcome the agent judges to be good on balance, and to make concessions from the agent’s preferred cooperative scheme so that other potential cooperators can find participation worthwhile (51-52). People with this disposition are “reasonable,” and when they agree on the fairness of a cooperative scheme, no one is motivated to make or seek further concessions.

In mastering the concept of fairness, individuals learn from examples of what is fair that certain features of cooperative schemes constitute reasons for their collective choice; extrapolation to new cases involves mutual influence between the disposition to pick out relevant descriptive similarities between the exemplar cases and the new cases and the disposition to cooperative motivation. Cooperative motivation takes on a certain intentional direction as it engages with picking out reasons to choose cooperative schemes with certain features. As McMahon emphasizes, the motivation does not emerge from pure practical reason in Kantian fashion: “Motivation must present itself, to be accepted, rejected, and ultimately shaped by judgments whose content is provided by target-setting concepts” (62).

No single cooperative scheme can be expected to emerge as the fair scheme. An individual engaged in the process of making mutual concessions with others may regard a proposed scheme as possessing features that support or undermine its choice-worthiness. Which schemes get serious consideration depends on the socially available normative and evaluative concepts. For example, socially available concepts within a group may include ones that present effort as a basis for distributing benefits and burdens of a cooperative venture. Other concepts might present need as a basis for distribution (56). Participants in shared deliberation will likely differ in how they apply these concepts to the issue at hand and in the priority they would accord, say, to effort versus need.

Consider disagreement over the question of whether fairness requires public provision of assisted living. Most people addressing this question will reason by analogy. Those favoring public provision will hope to establish relevant similarity to policies that are already seen as fairly required, such as public provision of hospital services to the elderly. Those opposing public provision of assisted living might hope to establish relevant similarity to policies already seen as not required by fairness, such as household maintenance or companionship for the elderly. Shared deliberation will focus on a set of such cases collectively assembled. Agreement is unlikely, McMahon asserts, when the issue is organization of political cooperation. When each member has a long history of experience with application of the relevant concepts, it will not be feasible for each individual to present all the examples of correct application that influence her thinking. Individuals may simply fail to see the analogies that others see. They will vary in their ability to express relevant personal experience, and some of this experience will be non-conceptual and resist full expression in speech. While unreasonable views will be winnowed out by shared deliberation, there will remain a “zone” of reasonable disagreement, a range of reasonable views.

The zone is subject to change over time and across different groups and societies, since shared deliberation within a given community must start with a variable and contingent set of evaluative and normative concepts, and the course of deliberation will depend on numerous variable factors. For example, the motivational idiosyncrasies of the people with whom a given individual is interacting can affect the pattern of concessions he finds acceptable (63). However, all zones of reasonable disagreement fall within certain broad boundaries defined by a set of core judgments that possess universal validity, such as prohibitions on murder and chattel slavery. Such requirements are “obviously in accord with the proper functioning” of the disposition to make concessions (123).

McMahon holds a realist construal of the proper functioning that underlies the correct deployment of moral concepts. As a “real normative attribute of persons,” proper functioning involves a form of self-awareness that one is not failing to make sense in the exercise of one’s cognitive capacities. Moral realists can be expected to ask, given that McMahon is willing to posit it as a real attribute of persons, why he does not instead or in addition posit real moral properties. His answer is likely that such a move would not provide enough space for reasonable disagreements, and this leads back to the need to pursue and evaluate what explanations might be available for the moral realist, or alternatively whether the moral realist is best off denying the phenomenon of reasonable disagreement.

On the other hand, those who are skeptical about real normative properties could ask what work a realistic construal of proper functioning does, especially if McMahon denies that a single correct outcome of shared deliberation can be expected. Criteria of consistency and coherence apply without need for a realistic construal of proper functioning. And once one specifies that political morality concerns the disposition to make concessions so that other potential cooperators can find participation worthwhile, one seems able to make a case for prohibitions against murder and chattel slavery without having to give a realistic construal of proper functioning.

The one job that a realistic construal might do for McMahon is a job that McMahon apparently does not want done. On a realistic construal, someone who wholly lacks the cooperative disposition is not as he ought to be. By McMahon’s association of ‘ought’ statements with the assertion of reasons to do what one ought, it would seem that person has a reason to cooperate. This line of reasoning comports with McMahon’s criticism of Humean instrumental reasoning as tying reasons to an agent’s desires in a way it ought not to. However, McMahon rather surprisingly asserts that a person who wholly lacks the cooperative disposition lacks a reason to be fair (64). He expresses doubt that a sociopath who lacks the cooperative disposition could learn what reasons of fairness are, and this makes sense given his claim that experiencing relevant dispositions to respond plays a crucial role in a person’s mastering evaluative concepts. However, a person’s failing to grasp a set of reasons does not entail that he does not have those reasons.

There is much else in McMahon’s book from which the reader can profit: judicious discussions of whether Western liberal democracies are required everywhere in the contemporary world, whether the dominance of capitalism may narrow the range of political moralities about which there can be reasonable disagreement, how zones of reasonable disagreements change over time, such that acceptance of forms of political hierarchy that are alien to modern Western sensibilities might not have been unreasonable in the past, and whether it was reasonable for colonizing European powers to have suppressed indigenous forms of spirituality. This book is highly recommended as a fresh perspective on central questions in metaethics and political morality.

1 The author of this review defends a theory of morality that shares a number of important themes with McMahon’s theory: that moral truths are perspective dependent, that fundamental moral disagreements are rooted in the different but significantly overlapping content of moral concepts held by groups and individuals, that there are universal constraints on what content a true morality could have, that morality functions to shape human motivation and not merely to serve it, and that much of this shaping function is accomplished through concepts of what moral reasons there are to perform certain actions. See David B. Wong, Natural Moralities: A Defense of Pluralistic Relativism (New York: Oxford UP, 2006). Though McMahon contrasts his theory with relativism, this author has a more expansive conception of relativism. This author therefore writes from a point of view that is fundamentally sympathetic to McMahon’s theory, though some challenges will here be raised for his theory.