Reasons and Intentions in Law and Practical Agency

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George Pavlakos and Veronica Rodriguez-Blanco (eds.), Reasons and Intentions in Law and Practical Agency, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 331pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107070721.

Reviewed by Jonathan Crowe, University of Queensland


This is one of those books where the papers from a conference session are gathered together in an edited volume. Books of this kind suffer from two common flaws: the theme may turn out to be too broad to produce a coherent set of papers and the contributions may prove to be of uneven quality. I am pleased to report that the present book avoids both these pitfalls. The essays are tightly grouped around a set of topical and important issues in theories of practical reasoning and philosophy of law. The contributions are uniformly very strong.

The book explores the connections between reasons and intentions in practical agency, with a particular focus on legal reasoning. The volume as a whole seeks to present a picture of normativity that emphasises the relationship between agents and reasons for action. The editors argue in their introduction that prominent internalist accounts of practical reasons seek to explain normativity in terms of agent-independent facts about what ought to be done (3). The essays in this collection, by contrast, explore the idea that the normativity of moral and legal reasons is best understood by connecting them with the agent's intentions. This approach links 'knowledge of what the agent is doing with knowledge of what it is good to do' (6).

The volume is divided into three parts. The first part, comprising four chapters, asks how intentional actions can give rise to normative reasons. It begins with two fairly technical essays on practical reasoning. Ulrike Heuer's chapter explores the connection between intentions and permissibility. She argues for the existence of what she calls 'reasons to act (or not to act) with a certain intention' (RAWCIs) (14). This offers a simpler and less contentious alternative to the doctrine of double effect in explaining certain kinds of cases where the permissibility of an action seems to turn on the agent's intention. The apparent existence of RAWCIs, Heuer argues, gives us reason to reject the view that intentions are irrelevant to permissibility.

Sergio Tenenbaum's chapter looks at the role of satisficing in practical agency. He argues plausibly that a focus on practical rationality as a feature of actions (rather than decisions or preferences) gives satisficing an important role, particularly for actions with long-term indeterminate consequences. Actions, Tenenbaum points out, extend through time. Our goals are often vague or indeterminate in the sense that the precise sequence of acts used to pursue an end is rarely specified by the end itself. Baking a cake or running a marathon, for example, can be done in numerous different ways consistent with that goal (38-40). It is not plausible that successfully performing these actions requires us to maximise the utility of each part of the sequence.

The next two chapters turn to legal reasoning. Heidi M. Hurd's clear and focused essay examines the plausibility of intentionalism as a theory of legal interpretation. She notes that defenders of originalism are often motivated by fidelity to intentions, so the plausibility of intentionalism is an indicator of the defensibility of originalism more generally (54). Intentionalism, however, struggles to deal with a fundamental question: what does it mean for a lawmaker to have an intention in relation to a dispute, such that the law should be interpreted in line with that intention (56)? If the content of the intention is merely a range of explicitly contemplated cases, then this will be insufficient to govern decisions the framers never thought about.

Appeals to hypothetical intentions or background principles, on the other hand, introduce considerations independent from the actual mental states of the drafters. It is therefore unclear how intentionalists can maintain their professed fidelity to authorial understandings of the legal text without relying on an implausible class of 'unconscious interpretive intentions' that somehow exist at the time of enactment and can be discovered by later interpreters (63). At the least, Hurd's argument places the burden on intentionalists to articulate more clearly what they mean by the intentions of lawmakers. She concludes, very sensibly in my view, by suggesting that the authority of law is properly located 'not in lawmakers but in legal texts' (66). Authorial intentions are best regarded as a mere heuristic for determining legal content.

Ori Simchen's chapter contrasts interpretationist and productivist strands in metasemantics and draws some lessons for legal interpretation. The dispute is about whether the semantic endowment of a term is determined by the conditions of its interpretive consumption or the conditions of its production or deployment (74). Simchen favours the latter view. He goes on to contrast Antonin Scalia's brand of textualism about legal reasoning with Ronald Dworkin's interpretivism and argues that Dworkin's view is preferable for metasemantic reasons. This is because Dworkin seeks the original semantic endowment of a legal text, whereas Scalia asks how the framers would have interpreted the text (which is a different thing).

The common theme in Hurd's and Simchen's chapters is that originalist and intentionalist views of legal interpretation, while professing fidelity to the legal text, actually distort the meaning of the text in their emphasis on authorial intentions (see also Crowe 2013a). The interpretation the framers would have placed on a text may differ significantly from what the text actually means because the framers may be poorly informed. A reference in a law to a concept such as 'cruel punishment' refers to what is actually cruel (according to the best available account of the matter), not whatever the framers may have thought was cruel at the time.

The second part of the book contains seven chapters exploring legal authority. Matthew Hanser is interested in the normative implications of doing someone else's bidding. He develops an account of this notion that captures what is morally risky about it: a person who does another's bidding (for example, by following an order or accepting a request) acquires a stand-alone and rationally opaque reason to execute the other person's intention (whatever it may be) (112). This is risky because it places the quality of her action in another's hands. She takes it on faith that the other person has sufficient reasons for the actions she performs.

Veronica Rodriguez-Blanco raises some related issues in her chapter on intentional agency and legal authority. She criticises Joseph Raz for offering distinct accounts of the role of reasons for action in ethics and law. Raz generally regards actions as intentional if they are taken in the belief that there is some good in them (2010). Legal rules, on the other hand, are exclusionary reasons for action: they pre-emptively exclude certain reasons from consideration in deciding what to do. Rodriguez-Blanco argues that Raz's notion of an exclusionary reason would mean that we follow legal rules unintentionally. However, this suggests that following legal rules involves peripheral, rather than full, agency. She proposes an alternative account of legal authority that preserves the transparency of the good-making characteristics of rule-following.

Antony Hatzistavrou also discusses Raz's concept of an exclusionary reason. He is interested in the kinds of reasons that are excluded by the directive of a legitimate authority. Specifically, he suggests that such directives present what he calls 'reconsideration-excluding reasons' that preclude agents from revisiting the balance of reasons behind the decision (148). He argues that this helps explain the epistemic value in following legitimate authorities: we maximise the benefit of the authority's directives where we genuinely trust its judgment. This seems like a useful, albeit fairly modest, supplement to Raz's conception of authority.

A. J. Julius is more sceptical about the role of authority, particularly as a response to coordination problems. His typically epigrammatic chapter explores the value of laws that direct us to do things we have independent reason to do. He argues that laws of this kind cannot give us any new reasons to act as we should, but they can help publicise our pre-existing reasons and facilitate democratic discussion. Laws might seem to solve coordination problems by stipulating an authoritative solution, but we solve these problems not by following the law, but by trying to predict what others will do (see also Crowe 2007; 2013b). This requires independent judgment by the various actors. There is, nonetheless, value in deliberating openly about our shared plans.

William A. Edmundson's chapter explores an important puzzle that goes to the heart of political authority. Sometimes, one hears rich (or moderately well-off) people say things like, 'I think the government should make me pay more taxes.' There is nothing stopping such a person making a donation to the government (or another social organisation) on top of their tax bill, but this rarely seems to happen. How can a person reasonably believe that others have a duty to force her to F, see them failing to do so, and yet believe she has no duty to F? Edmundson argues -- very plausibly -- that she cannot. He discusses various kinds of cases where such an attitude might seem reasonable and argues that they do not fit the bill. If you think someone has a duty to make you do something, but they don't, then you should go ahead and do it.

The next two chapters focus on Kant's views on legal and moral obligation. Ben Laurence seeks to understand how Kant's claim that juridical law is moral law is consistent with his distinction between juridical and ethical law. I am no Kant scholar, so I found this a bit hard to follow. I will leave others to judge the merits of the argument. George Pavlakos then examines the claim -- often attributed to Kant -- that law and morality give rise to distinct kinds of obligations. He argues that separating legal and moral obligations in this way threatens to fragment the meaning of our normative concepts. A focus on institutions as bridging the gap between our moral obligations and their instantiations in social contexts makes the distinction unnecessary. Pavlakos sees this account as consistent with Kant's views on moral obligation and autonomy.

The final part of the book contains three essays on social normativity. Kenneth M. Ehrenberg's chapter explores law's nature as an artifact. He argues that viewing law as an institution helps us to see how it can create non-prudential reasons for its subjects. Institutions are created by collective acceptance and can give rise to new reasons for those who recognise them. They may also confer deontic powers on certain offices and roles. Ehrenberg recognises that institutions can only create normative (as opposed to motivating) reasons where they hold legitimate authority, but he says little about how and when this might occur. I also would have liked to hear more about the role of functional attributes in constituting institutional artifacts (see Crowe 2014).

Manuel Vargas and Joshua P. Davis advance a pointed critique of Brian Leiter's reconstruction of American legal realism. Leiter argues that theories of legal adjudication should aim to offer empirically-grounded predictions of what legal officials will decide and refrain from normative prescriptions (2007). However, Vargas and Davis argue that it is possible to construct a predictive theory of adjudication drawing on psychosocial factors while also offering normative guidance for judges and other legal officials (268). There is no obvious reason why a commitment to naturalism rules out this sort of normative project. Vargas and Davis suggest that naturalists should be open to a range of complementary explanatory theories.

The final chapter by Bruno Verbeek considers the different kinds of authority manifested by conventions, social norms and law. Conventions are the interdependent expectations that support a pattern of social behaviour (299). Social norms, by contrast, are conventions backed by emotions such as resentment and indignation (306). Verbeek discusses each of these notions in detail. The chapter then ends with a brief treatment of law, suggesting that it has its own source of authority arising from a social norm telling subjects to comply with it. Verbeek makes this suggestion because he thinks law must have independent authority (312). However, as some of the earlier essays in the collection show, there may be good reason to question that assumption (see also Crowe 2007; 2013b). (Verbeek himself admits that he is not sure about it.)

The essays in the book are rich and topical. They cover a variety of different issues, but with many interesting connections between them. This is a book that repays close study. I recommend it to anyone who has an interest in these areas.


Thanks to Caitlin Goss and Constance Youngwon Lee for their helpful comments.


Jonathan Crowe, 'Natural Law in Jurisprudence and Politics' (2007) 27 Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 775

Jonathan Crowe, 'The Role of Contextual Meaning in Judicial Interpretation' (2013a) 41 Federal Law Review 417

Jonathan Crowe, 'Normativity, Coordination and Authority in Finnis's Philosophy of Law' in Mark Sayers and Aladin Rahemtula (ed.), Jurisprudence as Practical Reason (Supreme Court Library Queensland, 2013b)

Jonathan Crowe, 'Law as an Artifact Kind' (2014) 40 Monash University Law Review 737

Brian Leiter, Naturalizing Jurisprudence: Essays on American Legal Realism and Naturalism in Legal Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2007)

Joseph Raz, 'On the Guise of the Good' in Sergio Tenenbaum (ed.), Desire, Practical Reason and the Good (Oxford University Press, 2010)