Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science

Placeholder book cover

Christian Sachse, Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science, Ontos, 2007, 330pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793466.

Reviewed by Ingo Brigandt, University of Alberta


Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science develops a novel account of reduction in science and applies it to the relationship between classical and molecular genetics. However, rather than addressing the epistemological issues that have been essential to the reductionism debate in philosophy of biology, the discussion primarily pursues ontological questions, as they are known, about reducing the mental to the physical. For Sachse construes reductionism as a purely philosophical endeavor and defends the possibility of reduction in principle, which may not be relevant to understanding reductionist reasoning and explanation occurring in scientific practice, as discussed by philosophers of science. Likewise, the conceptual framework used stems more from metaphysics and philosophy of mind than philosophy of science. Sachse's aim is twofold. First, he argues for the special sciences' being reducible to physics, by deriving the in principle possibility of epistemological reduction from ontological reduction. Second, he attempts to simultaneously make room for the legitimacy of the special sciences, effecting a conservative reduction rather than an elimination of the special sciences.

Sachse's motivation and strategy are as follows. The traditional argument against reduction is based on multiple realization: a natural kind of a special science, denoted by a concept F, usually corresponds to several distinct physical kinds, denoted by concepts P1, P2, … . Since the special science offers unified generalizations and explanations in terms of concept F while physics has to make recourse to several distinct concepts to achieve the same result, the common view is that the special science concept can in certain contexts be preferred over the physical concepts. However, a few philosophers have drawn the opposite conclusion from the existence of multiple realization: the fact that special science concepts such as F ignore important physical differences (captured by P1, P2, …) is taken to imply that the special science concepts are to be eliminated in favor of the more fundamental physical concepts. Sachse's novel tenet is that for any physical concept Pi there is a co-extensional special science concept Fi (so that within the special science the kind denoted by the generic concept F is broken down into kinds denoted by the subconcepts F1, F2, …). Due to the co-extensionality of special science and physical concepts, the special science theory can be logically derived from and thus reduced to physics. Yet the reduction is non-eliminative: there are special science concepts F1, F2, … that are as fine-grained as the physical concepts, so that the fact that concept F misses relevant differences does not necessitate eliminating it in favor of physical concepts.

The first part of the book presents this account in general terms (Chapters 1-3), while the second part applies it in the context of reducing classical genetics to molecular biology (Chapters 4-8) -- the case on which the reductionism debate in philosophy of biology has focused. Chapter 1 addresses ontological reduction and introduces the main metaphysical notions from philosophy of mind, such as supervenience, token-identity, property dualism, epiphenomena, and causal overdetermination. Based on the premises of the causal completeness of physics and the supervenience of any fact on physical facts, Sachse (in line with the work of Jaegwon Kim 1998) gives an argument for ontological reduction, i.e., the idea that any entity falling under a special science concept is identical to an entity falling under a physical concept (token-identity).

Chapter 2 is the heart of the discussion, attempting to derive from the ontological reduction previously established the possibility of a version of epistemological reduction. The discussion does not lay out particularly well what this definition of reduction includes and what merely follows from it. Suffice it to say that Sachse's notion of epistemological reduction presupposes that each concept of the special science is co-extensional with a physical concept, i.e., no multiple realization obtains (85-88). As a result, all law-like generalizations of a special science can in principle be deduced from the laws of physics, and physics can in principle explain all phenomena described by the special science. Following Kim, Sachse argues that any concept of the special sciences (including biology) can be construed as a functional concept, i.e., a concept that defines a kind in terms of its causal dispositions and the cause-effect relations in which it participates.

Assume that the kind denoted by the functional (special science) concept F is realized by at least two distinct physical kinds P1 and P2. (I use the same letter for a kind and the concept denoting it.) Sachse's central aim of constructing functional concepts F1 and F2 that are co-extensional with the physical concepts P1 and P2 is based on the following tenet: "For any difference in composition accounting for two different types of realizers, there is a difference in dispositions, and for any difference in dispositions, there is an environment possible in which [1] this difference becomes manifested and [2] leads to a functional difference that is detectable in terms of the special sciences" (143). As this immediately entails the existence of co-extensional concepts, a general argument for this pivotal assumption would be necessary but is unfortunately not given. Condition 1 is clearly true provided that the 'possible' environments can include counterfactual and quite unusual environments, while it may be controversial whether the essential condition 2 holds in every case. Sachse's hypothetical example is a classical gene, F= 'gene that produces yellow blossoms', which is realized in different organisms by distinct molecular kinds P1 and P2. His idea is that P1 may possess a higher resistance to ultraviolet light than P2, so that in such a possible environment the molecular difference shows up, where in a P1 plant yellow blossoms develop somewhat faster than in a P2 plant. This yields a selective advantage of P1 plants over P2 plants that is detectable after some generations so that the molecular difference among plants can be captured using the concepts of non-molecular biology. These non-molecular concepts permit the construction of functional subconcepts co-extensional to the physical concepts, e.g. F1='gene that produces yellow blossoms and confers selective advantage' and F2= 'gene that produces yellow blossoms and confers selective disadvantage' (151).

There are several potential problems with this account. As the physical difference between P1 and P2 -- implying a difference in causal disposition -- shows up under special, non-actual environmental circumstances, the functional concept F1 has to specify not only how the disposition is manifested, but also the circumstance in which it is manifested. Sachse ignores the latter: the above example erroneously attempts to identify F1 with 'gene that produces yellow blossoms and confers selective advantage'. Instead it should be 'gene that produces yellow blossoms and confers selective advantage if circumstance C obtains'. Given that the physical difference may be detectable by the special science only in a highly counterfactual or abnormal circumstance C, the concept F1 makes reference to a condition that is irrelevant to the normal application conditions of the concept -- which good scientific concepts never do. In contrast to genuine concepts from science that are formed for the purposes of scientific generalization and explanation, Sachse artificially constructs concepts to achieve 'reduction', understood by him as a purely philosophical endeavor. Moreover, the fact that Sachse ignores that circumstance C has to be included in the special science concept F1 leads to genuine problems given that he explicitly acknowledges that C need not be specifiable in terms of the special sciences: "Let us add that this argument does not depend on the ability of the biologist to distinguish the environmental/physical conditions in her own terms. It is sufficient that some physicist conceives environmental conditions and some biologist detects a functional difference… . it does not matter whether or not 'ultra-violet light' [circumstance C] is a biological or a physical concept" (143-144, see also 277). As a result, Sachse's argument does not show that the subconcepts F1 and F2 are special science concepts, as required.

Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science aims at constructing special science concepts co-extensional with physical concepts for a twofold purpose: to show an in principle reducibility to physics and -- this is the particularly innovative idea -- to make room for a conservative reduction that avoids the elimination of the special science. However, it can be doubted whether the co-extensional concept strategy achieves the latter aim. There are two incompatible conclusions that one can draw from the fact that a special science kind F is realized by several distinct physical kinds P1, P2, … . Either the special science concept F is legitimate in some contexts (the standard interpretation), or F is to be eliminated in favor of the more fine-grained and fundamental physical concepts P1, P2, … . Sachse, however, wants to have it both ways: he uses the eliminativist argument as the very motivation to construct novel special science subconcepts F1, F2, … (144), yet in line with the standard interpretation assumes that the generic special science concept F is scientifically respectable and need not be eliminated (180). If one actually buys into the eliminativist argument, then one should first eliminate the generic concept F in favor of the subconcepts F1, F2, … , each of which (unlike F) does not refer to a multiply realized kind. In this case, the introduction of special science concepts F1, F2, … is a Pyrrhic victory, as it leads to the elimination of the traditional special science concepts.

Second, why not eliminate F1, F2, … in favor of the co-extensional and more fundamental physical concepts P1, P2, … , resulting in the elimination of the special science altogether? Sachse's argument may establish that there are co-extensional special science concepts, but not what they look like. It is fair to assume that each consists in a complex and rather awkward disjunction of conjunctions or (counterfactual) conditionals, in contrast to the more natural concepts F and P1, P2, … . In this case even an anti-reductionist would prefer using the physical concepts P1, P2, … over artificially introducing scientifically useless special science concepts F1, F2, … . Sachse offers several suggestions why elimination need not follow on his account (152-157, 178-180), e.g., the idea that concept F and the generalizations in which it figures can be integrated into a network of generalizations involving special science concepts F1, F2, … , so that using F1, F2, … one can say within the special science what is useful about the generic concept F. Yet to my mind, these ideas do not touch upon the issue raised by the elimination argument -- which Sachse apparently accepts. While eliminativism has been proposed in philosophy of mind, it is uncommon in philosophy of science. For instance, Marcel Weber (2005) endorses a notion of reductionistic, physico-chemical explanation in biology that permits the explanans to contain non-molecular concepts. Even classical reductionists such as Ernest Nagel (1961) assumed that wholesale theory reduction never entails elimination, as the fact that a higher-level theory can be logically derived from a more fundamental theory reconfirms the truth of the former.

Chapter 3 draws implications from the existence of co-extensional concepts. In particular, whereas anti-reductionists have typically accepted ontological reduction (token-identity) but denied epistemological reduction, Sachse argues that a form of epistemological reduction follows from ontological reduction (and vice versa). However, he is oblivious to the fact that his notion of 'epistemological' reductionism faces the same objections that have prominently been raised against traditional models of theory reduction (as developed by Ernest Nagel 1961 and Ken Schaffner 1993) in the context of biology. Namely, the objection is that such a notion of reductionism is so weak that it is trivially true (it immediately follows from ontological reduction), and that it is epistemologically irrelevant as it fails to capture salient features of theory structure, explanation, and scientific change in biology. Sachse defends the in principle possibility of theory reduction -- which ignores actual science, including reductionistic research -- by assuming that the reducing science (physics or molecular biology) is in possession of a complete theory that explains every phenomenon in its domain. In contrast to many philosophy of science accounts that have addressed reduction in science, the book does not consider scientific explanation, theory structure, and concept usage in practice due to its exclusive focus on in principle arguments.

In particular, philosophers of biology have discussed different models of epistemological reduction that are stronger or weaker and that distinguish different epistemic units to be reduced: whole scientific fields, whole theories, individual laws, individual concepts, particular explanations. Yet Sachse collapses many epistemological distinctions from philosophy of science, in part because he is inspired by a conceptual framework more popular in metaphysics and philosophy of mind. For instance, he assumes that singular causation implies general causation, and that both are always due to the operation of laws. From the existence of a causal relation -- an ontic fact -- the epistemic conclusion is drawn that an explanation is available to science, where explanations always involve laws (in contrast to modern models of mechanistic explanation). Despite the existence of a vast body of literature on reduction in science, and especially on reduction in genetics, the only account of reduction presented in the book is Nagel's model, which Sachse misconstrues by maintaining that Nagel required co-extensional concepts and ascribing metaphysical views to him that logical positivists did not endorse. Finally, Sachse assumes a two-level picture, where an alleged homogeneous molecular biology reduces a so-called classical genetics. This two-level framework may be legitimate in the context of the relation between mental and bodily phenomena; yet biological explanations often involve concepts from several biological subdisciplines or pertaining to several levels of organization, so that a different approach to reduction is needed to capture actual science.

Chapters 4-7 discuss the reduction of classical to molecular genetics. The reader who has hoped that the general argument of the preceding chapters would be made concrete and strengthened based on an actual empirical case is going to be seriously disappointed by the biological part of the book. While Chapter 4 is nothing but an overview of the book's second part, the subsequent chapter provides an account of classical genetics, in particular the classical gene concept. Chapter 6 gives a sketchy and rather incomplete account of molecular genetics. The fact that classical genes are token-identical with DNA segments (ontological reduction as discussed in general terms by Chapter 1) is simply asserted without laying out the empirical evidence in any detail (241, 248). The essential feature of the molecularization of genetics­ -- the advent of a molecular gene concept (distinct from the classical gene concept) -- is not mentioned in this book.

Chapter 7 intends to show reduction of classical to molecular genetics by constructing co-extensional concepts. However, the same abstract argument from Chapter 2 is repeated without any additional empirical support. Chapter 2 used the hypothetical example of a 'gene for yellow blossoms', and this continues to be the only example discussed. Chapter 7 does not consider any actual classical gene occurring in a certain species (concept F), how it has been tied to the molecular level, or to which distinct molecular kinds it corresponds (concepts P1, P2, …). No concrete non-molecular concept F1 is put forward, laying out why it is co-extensional to molecular concept P1. Instead, it is reasserted that distinct molecular realizers of a 'gene for yellow blossoms' can be distinguished as they have a differential selective advantage under condition of ultraviolet light -- which does not show the existence of co-extensional concepts even in this somewhat hypothetical case. The empirical-historical facts about classical and molecular genetics mentioned in Chapters 5-7 hardly feed into the philosophical argument for co-extensional concepts.

Despite Sachse's claim that "hearts are defined by their causal efficacy per se to pump blood" (222), biologists individuate morphological structures not based on their function, but in terms of homology, i.e. common ancestry (Griffiths 2006). Even if the argument of Chapter 2 that every special science concept is co-extensional with a functional concept is valid, the latter has a different intension and thus is a different concept. Given that the individuation schemes used by biologists -- often in terms of structure or homology rather than function -- are the basis for descriptions, generalizations, and explanations, Sachse's focus on functional concepts does not fully reflect how theorizing and explanation proceed within biology. Thereby the account misses an epistemic issue that has been essential to the reduction debate.

Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science is apparently a dissertation that was published without modification. One should not expect a dissertation to be particularly readable, but this is a very tedious one. The discussion is extremely repetitive. Within sections, the discussion may start with on overview of the whole section, provide a somewhat redundant account, and then summarize the whole discussion again. Across sections and chapters, some of the book's basic arguments are restated a half dozen times. The arguments provided are clear, yet trivial steps are overexplained in such detail that the whole book reads like an extended parody of analytic philosophy and its style. The introduction (Chapter 0) gives a sketch of the whole philosophical argument, but does not motivate the discussion by explaining the relevance of this account of reduction or indicating how it relates to the previous literature.

In sum, Reductionism in the Philosophy of Science attempts to show how to achieve epistemological reduction without eliminating the reduced theory, by introducing the innovative idea of breaking down concepts of the reduced science into subconcepts that are co-extensional with those of the reducing science. Reductionism traditionally combines ontological, epistemological, and methodological ideas. As this book is somewhat insensitive to the epistemological aspects and does not mention the methodological dimension (and does not base its philosophical account on actual science), it is more a contribution to the literature in metaphysics / philosophy of mind rather than philosophy of science / philosophy of biology.


Griffiths, P. E. (2006) "Function, homology, and character individuation." Philosophy of Science 73: 1-25.

Kim, J. (1998) Mind in a Physical World. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Nagel, E. (1961). The Structure of Science. New York: Harcourt, Brace, and World.

Schaffner, K. F. (1993). Discovery and Explanation in Biology and Medicine. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Weber, M. (2005) Philosophy of Experimental Biology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.