Reflecting Subjects: Passion, Sympathy, and Society in Hume's Philosophy

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Jacqueline A. Taylor, Reflecting Subjects: Passion, Sympathy, and Society in Hume's Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2015, 196pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198729525.

Reviewed by Christopher Williams, University of Nevada, Reno


In the final paragraph of his Treatise of Human Nature, Hume declared that while the "anatomist ought never to emulate the painter," the former was "admirably fitted to give advice" to the latter and added that it was "even impracticable" to paint without doing the anatomical homework first. Hume's own ambition in the Treatise lay in psychological (and, increasingly, sociologically informed) anatomy, not engaging portraiture, but he clearly envisaged a progression from one to the other. Exploiting abundant textual sources, Jacqueline A. Taylor provides us, on Hume's behalf, with a progression of this sort in her book. She begins with a reconstruction of selected elements in Hume's moral psychology and social theory and ends with a defense of the resources that her reconstruction affords for philosophical reflection concerning social practices. Pride, sympathy, and humanity -- as Hume delineates each -- are the trio of ideas that anchor her narrative (and it is this trio at which the subtitle of the book gestures). Of the three, the greatest of these is humanity. For not only is humanity the "key concept" of Hume's moral philosophy (100), it is "a central concept of the Enlightenment, one with continuing significance for us today" (161). Although aimed at Hume specialists, Taylor's discussion can be consulted profitably by those who want to know why, or even whether, Hume matters to 21st-century philosophical inquirers.

The book has six chapters. The first gives an overview of Hume's methodology in treating of the passions -- more specifically, the four indirect passions (pride, humility, love, hatred) -- and a statement of the results of the application of that methodology. According to Taylor, Hume's "experimental" approach to the passions involves a commitment to their casual explanation (in terms of efficient causation, via Hume's associationist mechanisms in Book Two of the Treatise), and this style of explanation is "neutral with respect to any evaluative hypothesis" concerning the passion-causes and "minimalist in the sense that the different categories . . . of the causes" are elucidated by the same mechanisms (30, Taylor's emphases).

The next two chapters deal with aspects of Hume's social theory, by which Taylor has in mind "an explanation of the indirect passions in relation to . . . forms of social power [and] styles of living, learning, and working, and the commitment to various values" (34). The cash value of this understanding of social theory is that the passions people actually experience are "fundamentally culturally structured" (37). Because they are so structured, sympathy -- the transmission of sentiment across persons -- turns out to be an important element in the explanation of how passions -- and more generally, "patterns of feeling and behavior" (70) -- arise and are perpetuated. Social power, the very idea, receives considerable attention, and Taylor takes a particular interest in the ways social rank (typically as established by wealth and property, including, notably, the ownership of slaves) and gender roles constitute power (or the lack of it). While developing these themes, she attempts to defend Hume against the charge made by philosophers such as R. G. Collingwood and Alasdair MacIntyre that he has an ahistorical, uniformitarian picture of human nature, and she situates Hume in relation to other theorists of emotion (such as William James, Jesse Prinz, and Claire Armon Jones).

In the three remaining chapters, Taylor shifts her view to moral feeling: how Hume thought we recognized it, what Hume thought we could recognize by it, and whether we can recognize more, perhaps, than what Hume did himself. Taylor begins with the account of moral judgment in Book Three of the Treatise but finds it defective, thinking that Hume "neglects the social inequalities he has examined and instead appears to regard all persons as having more or less equal moral standing" as evaluators (100). And in connection with the appraisal of a person's character, which is based, for Hume, on the sentiments of the appraised person's circle of acquaintance, Taylor finds that he "fails to allow for moral judgments that reflect the independent judgment of moral evaluators" (120). Yet she finds more promising materials for a Humean moral philosophy in the second Enquiry, where we encounter the possibility of a more disinterested and more refined capacity for evaluative response, a moral sentiment that genuinely reflects (in Hume's words) the force of many sympathies.

As for the self-appraisals that persons undertake, this version of the moral sentiment is capable of properly certifying pride as a virtue (as against the Christian tradition and its secularized Hobbist successor). Pride is closely linked to a person's dignity, and it might well be the case that dignity is the quality that the moral sentiment ultimately registers. For when Taylor's attention turns, in the last chapter, from the proud self to the community of other selves (who may not be proud, given prevailing social arrangements), the feeling for their humanity is a response to their dignity, an acknowledgment that their voices should (or, rather more realistically, can) be heard. To the extent that the acknowledgment takes the form of socially recognized rights and privileges, the guaranteeing of those rights and privileges is the space that a theory of justice occupies -- not, indeed, Hume's own officially modest theory but one that Taylor claims is nevertheless true to Hume.

Taylor's book displays a refreshingly concrete awareness of the ways in which concepts traditionally investigated by philosophers are socially realized. As already noted, the discussion of power in the third chapter is primarily about social power: how society makes exercises of power possible for persons and how differential relations of power between persons arise within societies. This cultural emphasis is very much in the catholic spirit of Hume, and readers for whom the shock of billiard balls remains the paradigm of Humean causation can expect to be set straight by Taylor. In providing a wealth of pertinent detail, her book makes valuable contributions to a more three-dimensional understanding of Hume, especially in the later chapters.

Aspects of her narrative do raise some questions, however. The indirect passions are central to her analysis, and the causes that produce them, on her showing, are one reason Hume's psychological account is important. But it seems that Taylor is mainly concerned with the pride/humility pair of passions, not the love/hatred pair, and her stress on causes, moreover, best matches Hume's own methodology with respect to pride and humility. One contrast between Hume's treatments of the two pairs of indirect passions is that whereas he examines the variety of causes for pride and humility, it is the variety of compounds that the (basic) passions of love and hatred form that persistently attract his attention. Taylor's focus is thus narrower than Hume's. This is not at all a problem, I think, because pride, and the closely related notion of dignity, are so vitally important at the end of the story she aims to tell. But the telling of that story might have been tightened had she announced that her topic was simply going to be pride, that unexpectedly many-splendored thing, and the grounds for, and routes to, its moral approval that Hume's sentiment-centric moral philosophy, itself historically surprising, supplies.

On a more substantive note, there are concerns we might have about the causal investigation of the passions. As we saw above, the investigation is supposed to be neutral with respect to our evaluation of the causes. But is it really? How ultimately separable the anatomist and the painter are in matters of the mental is a difficult general question, but even if we restrict ourselves to Hume interpretation it is possible to find signs that separation is not unproblematic. In the Dissertation on the Passions, Hume characterizes pride as "a certain satisfaction with ourselves, on account of some accomplishment or possession, which we enjoy" and humility as "a dissatisfaction with ourselves, on account of some defect or infirmity." To call the cause an accomplishment or defect is already to have taken an evaluative stand; reflection, once the anatomical work is wrapped up, does not introduce that element. If evaluation has already been made, and philosophers are not its authors, it would seem that evaluation must come from the dispositions available in a given society. Those dispositions could lead the members of a society who internalize them to regard ownership of slaves as an accomplishment, for example.

Taylor would hardly dispute this possible source of pride, and her remarks on the cultural constitution of pride underline the contingency, agreeable in this instance, of such a source. But if the anatomist, in order to get going, will take for granted more of the painter's craft than we initially suspected, then it could seem that the causal investigation will deliver more conservative, and more history-bound, results than it initially seemed to offer. Although the better-read members of a society will most likely concur with Hume that the "remains of domestic slavery, in the American colonies, and among some European nations, would never surely create a desire of rendering it more universal," those same persons could take considerable (and not readily imperiled) pride in the slaves they happen to own.

This point is important for two reasons. The first is that Taylor's purpose in revealing the cultural constitution of phenomena is different from Hume's. The contingency of social constitution makes room, on Taylor's view, for reflection on the desirability of practices so constituted, and the practices might be changed. But when Hume considers cultural constitution (that which is "artificial," in his idiom), he wants to show that the artificial has as solid a claim to authority as the natural, artificiality notwithstanding. As a consequence, Taylor's Hume tends to sound more implicitly reformist than Hume usually does.

The other reason is that there may be less room in Hume's outlook for philosophy to do the work that Taylor hopes for. The historical evolution of the moral sense will be a piecemeal affair for the Humean, and Taylor has a good thought, in her final pages, when she says that "the process by which the members of a moral community are included or excluded in the practice of moral appraisal" (189) is one wherein "we negotiate the virtues of moral evaluation" (190, emphasis hers). I take it that this means that we do not necessarily foresee how the negotiations will turn out. But should we expect philosophers -- the humane Humeans -- to lead the negotiating team? They can doubtless contribute a bit, and that bit of theirs should be welcomed, but an argument can be made that Hume's general approach inclines us to expect that refinement in our evaluative sentiments will emerge from various (unrelated) quarters and for various (and perhaps conflicting) reasons. This thought might fund a different criticism of Hume from the type of criticism Taylor advances. An area in which Hume does show reformist zeal is religion. But if some evaluative dispositions are traceable to religious ideas current in a society, then Hume can be faulted for slighting their influence, and the complaint would not be merely about an historical slight but a philosophical one.

Relatedly, Taylor may overrate the power of sympathy, a capacity that persons of refined sensibility would possess to a high degree. The desirability of expanding sympathy (by whatever name we call it) has a pronounced moral tinge for us today, and humanities education is often justified on the ground that it helps to cultivate the expansion. However, when Taylor writes, "Sympathy is thus the means of reproducing and sustaining forms of social life and schemes of value" (70, emphases hers), I hesitate. The transmission of value -- tradition in the best sense -- is needful for any society, but it seems unduly confident to assign this job to sympathy. It is possible that Taylor is thinking of a critical transmission of value in which sympathy should have a role. But even with such a qualification, caution is advisable. One of Hume's examples of historically changed sentiment -- an example that Taylor also briefly mentions (124) -- concerns tyrannicide. If we would know why (in contrast to our ancient forebears) we disapprove of the killing of obnoxious princes, a straightforward explanation merely adverts to the inconveniences (as Hume might put it) of the practice, to its long-term destabilizing impact on governments. The explanation need make no appeal to sympathy (even if, as in the ostensibly similar case of justice, sympathy does enter into the explanation of our approval once sentiment regarding tyrannicide has changed). A relatively bland appeal to "history and experience" could suffice here as well as in many other cases of changed sentiment.

These animadversions of mine are not meant to detract from the value of Taylor's book. The disagreements here might even resolve, to a certain extent, into differences of recommended tone. Like Hume's Treatise, this book gains force as it proceeds. In particular, the conception of dignity that occupies center stage by the end presents a salutary reminder that dignity is far from being an exclusive possession of those who prefer Kant to Hume. Readers who maintain the opposite predilection will applaud that reminder.