Reimagining the Sacred: Richard Kearney Debates God

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Richard Kearney and Jens Zimmermann (eds.), Reimagining the Sacred: Richard Kearney Debates God, Columbia University Press, 2016, 286pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231161039.

Reviewed by Daniel O'Dea Bradley, Gonzaga University


This is a collection of conversations among Richard Kearney and many of the leading thinkers in Continental Philosophy of Religion. The format makes the book an ideal text for an introduction to a Phenomenology of Religion course. However, it is for its contribution to philosophy more widely that I wish to review the book here, and in my view the contribution is significant.

Recognizing that significance is aided by the adoption of a certain hermeneutical method. At the beginning of both Anatheism and Reimagining the Sacred, Kearney relates a formative experience he had in taking classes with Paul Ricœur in Paris. Ricoeur would open the course by asking his students, "D'où parlez-vous?" This desire to understand where his students were coming from, what motivated and interested them, was an important part of Ricœur's philosophy. That method reveals the central philosophical interest of this collection of dialogues and has been an important part of Kearney's contribution to contemporary philosophy, for in conversation philosophers often reveal the deep questions and hungers that drive their thinking in ways that are not always clear in their more polished and careful arguments in journal articles and monographs. Thus, this text is philosophically important in its ability to reveal the deep motivations that drive much of Continental Philosophy of Religion and in Kearney's call to pay attention to aspects of the sacred to which this dominant orientation has been closed.

With this question of motivations in mind, it is striking how, again and again, the contributors advert to a state of crisis in contemporary humanity. Understandings of this crisis are not identical, but they tend to gravitate around four interrelated themes: the nihilism that arises from the death of God, the existential alienation that arises from the disenchantment of the world, the loss of confidence in the Enlightenment project occasioned by the mass deaths of the 20th century, and the destructive polarization between an arrogant and reductive materialism and an arrogant and doctrinaire Christianity that has come to divide families, friends, and communities. This complex interplay of metaphysical, axiological, political, and sociological challenges is often referred to in these conversations by the proper names of Nietzsche and Weber, but its inner unity emerges from the question of the role of the sacred in the late modern or post-industrial world. Perhaps the first and clearest claim, unanimously agreed upon by all the participants, is that the relevance of this question of the sacred will not quietly disappear as truths are accumulated through modern mathematical science and as material needs are met by industrial production, but that neither is a return to a metaphysics prior to the masters of suspicion possible.

However, on the heels of this consensus emerges a deep rift between the followers of Levinas, represented here by Jean-Luc Marion, John Caputo, James Wood, Gianni Vattimo, and Simon Critchley, for whom the crisis occasioned by the disenchantment of the world may be painful, but is an almost unalloyed good on the path to truth, and those such as Julia Kristeva, Catherine Keller, Charles Taylor, Jens Zimmermann, David Tracy, and Kearney who believe that the iconoclasm of a philosophy of alterity must be accompanied by a retrieval of the sacred, through renewed attention to traditional stories, ideals, liturgical rituals, a re-enchantment of nature, etc. As Kearney is at the center this conversation, this rift reveals his voice in particular as a clarion call issued to Continental Philosophy of Religion to pay more attention to particular embodied practices, a call that is in fact a research agenda that Kearney has come to describe as Carnal Hermeneutics.[1] I believe this to be an extremely important and fruitful project making Kearney's one of the most important voices in contemporary philosophy; however, I also suggest that despite its importance, it remains limited by his exclusive commitment to a "weak god" theology.

Kearney's criticism of the Levinasian tradition centers on the claim that it leads to a quasi-transcendentalism in which the content of our experience is devalued. This leads to an ethical problem in which the desire for an encounter with the other that transcends our categories of understanding leaves us hungering for alterity but without the resources to discern between others who need our help, others who can help us, and others who would lead us into delusion and darkness. It also leads to a quasi-transcendental philosophy of religion that is blind to the encounters with the divine in particular stories, sensuous objects, rituals, etc. This critique has two main consequences: a call for the tradition to open itself to a more sacramental and sensuous spirituality and a call to think about ways an encounter with the sacred could be thought in communal and historical rather than merely individual terms.

At the center of both questions, that of discernment and the sacramental, lies the importance of the Levinasian heritage. When Marion argues that "the decision is more of an 'ethical' question in Levinas's sense" (188), Kearney responds, "even in that case, do we not still have the problem of how to discern between Nietzsche's Dionysius or Heidegger's Last God or Derrida's Messianic Other? Or Christ?" (189) And when Critchley appeals to a Levinasian ethics of the Other, Kearney responds,

I see what you are saying in terms of the Levinas analogy. But to get back to the 'cry in the street,' there are, I think, very different kinds of cries as well as very different kinds of responses. Right? One kind says, 'Where are you? Feed me! Clothe me! Give me water to drink! Help!' Another says, 'Schnell, into the gas chamber!' There is a difference between 'Hail Mary' and 'Heil Hitler' after all! They are not ontologically or ethically the same, or similar, or equiprimordial. Granted they are all structurally cries, but each is delivered, uttered, shouted in a radically different 'spirit' in each case . . . There is a huge difference, in short, between the cry that kills and the cry that loves, the cry that takes life and the cry that gives it, the cry that calls for 'yes' or 'no.' (154)

This insistence on the "No" is a welcome rejoinder to the "oui, oui" that runs so copiously through the tradition, and it opens a space for philosophy to take a more critical stance towards contemporary culture and politics. Later, Kearney is even more explicit; "here is my problem with Levinas, too -- the lack of discrimination and discernment with regard to different kinds of Others. For Levinas, they all seem to be lumped into one. As with Derrida who follows him in saying 'every Other is every Other' (tout autre est tout autre)." (155) We could look at many similar passages in this book, but Kearney's insistence on the importance of discernment runs throughout his work and is developed at length in Stranger, Gods, and Monsters.[2]

Newer to Kearney's project is his rehabilitation of "content" in relation to the question of the sacred. The quasi-transcendentalism to which Kearney is opposed in this register is most clearly revealed in his conversation with Caputo, who tells him, "the things we think, the thoughts we have, the stories we tell, the narratives we recite are all contingent and inherited . . . And so those differences cannot count in the long run. What does count is the underlying affirmations that are enacted or deployed in the several traditions." (212) Kearney is clear that this abstraction from the particularities of a tradition occasioned by this spiritual transcendentalism is mistaken. Rather, we must pay attention to "the historical wisdom traditions which provide concrete possibilities of the sacred -- namely sacred narratives, times, places, rituals, liturgies, prayers, and sacraments. Doesn't the search for transcendence benefit from such acts of religious embodying and embedding -- putting flesh on the otherwise rootless, faceless Word?" (81)

In a similar vein, Kearney tells Critchley, "I don't want to have to rid faith of its sacramentalities and scriptures, to have it serve as a mere 'structure' of subjectivity. Sometimes you seem, as we discussed above, to go more for the structure than the substance of faith." (159) And he tells Marion, "I agree with you about the need to go beyond representations of God in the sense of political and metaphysical idolatries, but in Anatheism I do insist on the indispensable role of narrative imagination and testimony. I am wary of leaving empty spaces too empty, so I endorse a sacred poetics of epiphany." (184)

This worry about transcendentalism is a particular kind of argument and must be judged in the spirit of our hermeneutic search for motivations. In my view, Kearney is correct in his diagnosis of its origins in one-sidedly iconoclastic and puritanical aspects of the Abrahamic tradition, transmitted through Levinas (and Kierkegaard) to Derrida and then on to saturate so much of contemporary philosophy of religion. Conversely, Kearney's work is motivated by desires not being met by Continental Philosophy of Religion, motivations I share, including the desire to reorient the wisdom of the sacred traditions towards communal action (both of organized protest and community building) and the desire to integrate a reflection on the sacredness of rituals, nature, art and other aspects of the sensuous world so emphasized by Catholics, Sufis, indigenous religions, etc. into our discipline. Kearney explains to Critchley what he feels is missing:

Shared stories make for shared actions. And I don't see either in the deconstructive atheism of Derrida or Agamben, for example (though they are both fascinated by messianic mysticism). Their 'messianicity' is that of the solitary, single one, the lonely mystic. Every time I read Fear and Trembling I see, I hear, Jacques Derrida, alone on the mountain, assailed by undecidable voices at the impossible moment of decision. To me, that is just too isolated and isolationist a philosophy -- a stance essentially evacuated of any practicable ethics or politics, devoid of hermeneutic guidelines as to how we might discern between spirits and act together towards shared goals. (171)

If this iconoclastic tradition forecloses communal action it also forecloses a sacramental understanding of the sensuous, and it is the same line by which this motivation enters contemporary philosophy of religion. Kearney also tells Critchley,

I do not want to get rid of the sacramental altogether. That's why in Anatheism I come back to Joyce, and Merleau-Ponty's notion of profane sacramentality . . . and I would add Gerard Manley Hopkins to this list, with his wonderful Scotist poetics of 'thisness.' The divine in the very haecceitas of things. The sacramentality of the everyday. Here I part company with Levinas's allergy toward the 'sacred' (with its blindness to animality and nature) and a certain form of Protestant Puritanism, which evacuates the sacredness of the flesh. (163)

Kearney comes back to this idea in his closing remarks to Critchley: "For me your Faith of the Faithless is full of protest and prophecy (as in Levinas), but it often seems to lack the sacramental. The Catholic moment accompanying the Protestant." (174)

In my view, this dual emphasis on renewing the tradition in order to be open to communal and sacramental dimensions of the sacred is a crucial one. Not only does it respond to motivations that have begun to arise from within the tradition, it also opens the possibility for Continental philosophers to engage with discussions about religion happening among scholars interested in inter-faith dialogue with less iconoclastic traditions. It further points the way toward discussions among evolutionary psychologists, for example with regard to the role of religion in group selection by mitigating the free-rider problem and thus working towards co-operation.

Kearney's work, as presented here in the context of the contemporary state of the discipline, is revealed to be of central importance in opening new dimensions of religious life to the investigations of phenomenological and hermeneutical philosophy, dimensions that have hitherto been covered over by the dominance of the influence of Levinas and Kierkegaard. However, I think his project has the potential to be even more fruitful if set free from an exclusive adherence to the "weakness of God" thesis. In the discussions in Reimagining the Sacred, Merold Westphal (229-231), Tracey (225-227), and Zimmermann (237-239) all provide important criticisms of this weak theology. The most important are that it exaggerates the place of the Crucifixion in an understanding of Kenosis and that it focuses on Christology at the expense of a broader Trinitarian theology. However, in line with my hermeneutic search for broad motivations within contemporary philosophy, I will look at weak theology as a response to a desire that moves the thinkers in this collection, which I think is representative of the culture more widely. This is the desire to overcome the potential of religion to play the role of an ideological weapon of the rich and elite by validating the structures of power that maintain their privilege.

In his introduction, Kearney writes, "Anatheism is not some ineluctable dialectic leading to a final totality. It is not about uppercase Divinity, or Alpha God. Au contraire! Anatheism is about reimagining -- and reliving -- the sacred in the least of these. It is lowercase from beginning to end." (8) This does direct our attention to the possibilities of discovering the sacred in important ways in the small, everyday things of life, of finding God in the "pots and pans" as Kearney reminds us Teresa of Avila was able to do. Kearney writes:

there is more in the less. There is creation and redemption in a piece of bread. This I call the sacramental in the broad sense, not confined to Catholic or Orthodox or any single denominational rite, but extendable to include epiphanic transformations of little things into holy things in our most everyday experiences. This is why I keep coming back to the 'petits miracles' of Proust, the 'little daily miracles' of Lily Briscoe, the 'cries in the street' of Joyce -- all infinitesimal instants that transubstantiate seemingly inconsequential and inexperienced experiences from emptiness into fullness. (35)

This is true, and Kearney's phenomenology of the little things is masterful. But it is a little unbalanced. If there is divinity in a piece of bread, there is also divinity in a cathedral; if there is divinity in an alpine flower, there is also divinity in the Orion nebula (as revealed by that great, 12 ton and $36 million product of techno-science, the Hubble Telescope). In fact, it is often the power of the "great" that helps us to see the sacredness of the small. The beauty and artistry of the Great Mosque of Djenné has the potential to help us to see God in the muddy banks of the Bani River, a potential that was there, but not easy to notice.

I will end by mentioning one ideological danger that emerges from the neglect of the sacredness of things great and mighty. Ironically, to see this we can turn to Daniel Dennett. In Darwin's Dangerous Idea, he explains how a scientist might come to make sense of the logic used by the Catholic Church in spending money building cathedrals when it could buy food and housing for the poor:

Our people, it says, benefit more from having a place of splendor in which to worship than from a little more food. Any atheist or agnostic who finds this cost-benefit analysis ludicrous might pause to consider whether to support diverting all charitable and governmental support for museums, symphony orchestras, libraries, and scientific laboratories.[3]

Cathedrals, public parks, museums, town squares, public transit systems, and other great and mighty cultural works are even more important to the poor than to the wealthy, who have their own private art collections and can escape the public space of our cities to their cabins in the San Juan Islands or their ski condos in Jackson Hole. Dennett recognizes that there is meaning in the great projects of science and culture and that participation in that meaning can enrich and ennoble the life of all.

There is a danger that weak theology and its emphasis on the small (and private?) can unwittingly serve as an ideological defense of the contemporary emphasis on voluntary charitable contributions and the de-funding of public works. This is especially important for Continental philosophy to remember in the American context where the public good is so much more marginalized than in Europe. To give one example, Ireland spends $53 per person per year to fund public broadcasting. Norway spends $180 and the United States $3. I am confident Kearney supports spending tax dollars on PBS and RTÉ, but his project would be broadened by a phenomenological analysis of the divine in the great works of culture and religion, and in consequence it would also be better able to contribute to a defense of large public expenditures on large public goods.

This call to expand Kearney's project appeals to my motivations, but also perhaps to others including those of my generation and younger who are more likely to have come under the surveillance of corporations than judgmental neighbors, who feel more threatened by the destruction of the environment than wars among nation states, and whose young adulthood was more likely to have been controlled by advertisers and market forces than authoritarian priests or sacred texts. Nonetheless, I take these to be complements to, rather than criticisms of, Kearney's philosophy, the importance of which is clearly revealed in this collection of essays and which, as the research project he calls Carnal Hermeneutics, will continue to bear much fruit -- in parts of the sacred garden that have rather been neglected of late.

[1] See Carnal Hermeneutics (Fordham Press, 2016), eds. Kearney and Brian Treanor.

[2] Stranger, Gods, and Monsters: Interpreting Otherness (Routledge, 2002).

[3] Darwin's Dangerous Idea (Simon and Schuster), 1995. p. 519.